Al-Ghazālī's Moderation in Belief

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Al-Ghazālī, Al-Ghazālī's Moderation in Belief, Aladdin M. Yaqub (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2013, 311pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226060873.

Reviewed by David B. Burrell, University of Notre Dame


Just as al-Ghazālī moved out from under the shadow of Ibn Rushd (Averroës), so attitudes of scholarship in matters of philosophical theology moved away from 'modernist' to 'post-modern' perspectives more amenable to integrating faith with reason. So the modernist picture of al-Ghazālī as standing in the way of reason began to erode, as the embracing context of scholarship moves away from such simplistic binaries. And Aladdin Yaqub's elegant and flowing translation certainly conveys that dimension of al-Ghazālī that I have characterized as 'postmodern', as he shows himself to be at home with faith or reason, using one to illuminate the other. This is huge step forward from the once-prevailing perspective that negatively polarised al-Ghazālī against the 'rationalist' Ibn Rushd, and from a similar conviction that al-Ghazālī had 'done in' philosophy for the Islamicate, so setting up stark polarities we find in some forms of modern Islam.

So this translation renders the spirit of a reconciling al-Ghazālī, as good translators hew closely to the text to convey its nuances to a contemporary readership. Yet what breaks this astute and apparently seamless rendering is Yaqub's need to enter into the thorny issue of causality, relying on relatively undefined terms like 'occasionalist'. Moreover, he seems to be of the impression that a relatively recent and careful study by Frank Griffel attempting to rescue al-Ghazālī from a stereotypical 'Ash'arite' set of strategies, which would have him denying true causality to creatures, has in fact won the day. But in fact Griffel offers a sharp critique of the polarities that Yaqub (unwittingly?) restores! So Yaqub manages to set the clock back to return to 'occasionalism', as vague as that charge has always been.

While there is no doubt that al-Ghazālī wants to see God's presence as free creator at work everywhere, it simply does not follow that creatures enjoy no freedom in a freely created universe -- as contemporary theologians Jennifer Herdt and Kathryn Tanner each have shown. And al-Ghazālī himself struggles to elucidate this very perspective in Faith in Divine Unity and Trust in Divine Providence (Fons Vitae, 2001, 22-29), an axial book in his 'summa theologiae', Ihya 'Ulum ad-Din. Yet this very intellectual struggle disappears from a summary evaluation of al-Ghazālī as an 'occasionalist'. It is that failure to regard him as a thinker whose intellectual struggles could in fact be helpful to us that animates my critique of the analysis attending a superb translation -- out of respect for al-Ghazālī himself.

So in reproducing the common western error of reading a theologian steeped in classical thought as a modern philosopher, Yaqub distorts the al-Ghazālī he has managed to translate so well. Moreover, even closer to the heart of Islamicist commentary, Richard Frank has shown carefully and astutely how a straightforward 'Ash'arite' reading will not do for al-Ghazālī. Yet Frank's work (which Yaqub fails to acknowledge) is rightly celebrated as among the most astute philosophical commentaries on al-Ghazālī. Similarly for the studies of Daniel Gimaret, who worked closely with Frank. Nor do I make this point simply to offer critical comment on an otherwise illuminating translation rendering a key text for our perusal. I rather make it as a translator, conscious of our responsibility to make a text accessible to contemporaries, yet to do so in the author's own terms, without colonizing it to privilege more recent categories of interpretation. A tricky business, indeed, as a perusal of Frank's prescient studies will reveal. So for making this key text of al-Ghazālī accessible in a lucid rendering, we can only register gratitude; yet for key attempts at interpretation, caveat lector.

By presuming the accuracy of their critical strategies, western scholars can easily set a trap for themselves, especially when attempting to grasp the thought-forms of thinkers in another cultural or historical epoch. A key indicator of such myopia on the part of scholars trained in the west is an uncritical use of the customary 'modern'/'pre-modern' analytic category, quite innocent of its ideological cast, which regularly parallels 'modern' with 'critical', and pre-modern' with 'uncritical'. Those of us who work in classical, or especially medieval texts, find such simplistic parallels at once unlettered and insulting, as well as finding those who regularly rely on them to exhibit a specific form of 'colonialism'.

Yet in the past (say) fifteen years, a younger group of scholars, often better equipped with linguistic and cultural skills, has begun to break the grip of their mentors to challenge the sufficiency of western analytic tools to elucidate the authors they have come to appreciate. Griffel's study of al-Ghazālī at once illustrates and exemplifies this point, while I have attempted to sketch a larger canvass challenging standard western presentations in "Islamic Philosophical Theology and the West," Islamochristiana 33 (2007) 75-90, and "Journey to Mulla Sadra: Islamic Philosophy II," Journal of Islamic Studies 3 (2010) 44-64. These explorations propose an axial role for al-Ghazālī, dividing Islamic philosophy into 'two phases', with the second integrating faith with reason far more effectively than the first. Yet the first is what is normally studied, while the heroes of phase two are at best mentioned: Ibn 'Arabi, Suhrawardi, Mulla Sadra. It should go without saying that a 'modernist' agenda will privilege the first, while a post-modern sensibility will be fascinated by the ways the second works to display the breadth of Islamic tradition by incorporating faith with reason in key inquiries. For further references opening up this vein of interpretation, see entries in Timothy Winter, ed., Cambridge Companion to Classical Islamic Theology, (Cambridge University Press, 2007), and in another vein, the collection designed to recover a rich Islamic tradition in the face of contemporary political misuses of it: Joseph E. B Lumbard, ed. Islam, Fundamentalism, and the Betrayal of Tradition: Essays by Western Muslim Scholars, 2nd ed. (World Wisdom Books, 2009).

One realizes that a review is hardly the place to offer further references, yet my purpose in doing so is to offer sources showing how this superb translator could render inquirers into Islamic philosophy a far better service than his analysis has been able do, thereby offering an alternative view of al-Ghazālī for readers today -- and one able to provide richer context for the al-Ghazālī text offered here.