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Peter Adamson, Al-Kindī, Oxford University Press, 2007, 272pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780195181432.

Reviewed by Daniel Davies, Clare Hall, Cambridge


Al-Kindī is widely known as the first of the Islamic philosophers. In ninth century Baghdad he gathered around himself a circle that was highly active in translating the Greek sciences into Arabic. As well as being the first of the Arab philosophers Al-Kindī is now the first of the Arab philosophers to be included in the Great Medieval Thinkers series. Al-Kindī was expert in a vast array of scientific disciplines and in this book Peter Adamson concentrates on the philosophical topics on which Al-Kindī wrote, as is appropriate for the series: metaphysics; ethics; psychology; medicine; cosmology. One of the many virtues of the book is that it focuses on elucidating the philosophical arguments themselves, in a way that is both sympathetic and critical, rather than only seeking their provenance or tracing their after-effects. Certainly, al-Kindī has long been recognised as a creative and voluminous writer, though, until now, the extent and nature of his originality had yet to be mapped. Adamson shows that al-Kindī deserves a place amongst the great philosophers in his own right and not only because of the pervading presence of his work in later Islamic and Arabic thought.

Mediaeval Islamic philosophers are increasingly being recognised for the value inherent in their work, rather than simply as conduits for the transfer of ancient Greek ideas to the Latin West. Al-Kindī was such an important figure in the history and development of Arabic philosophy that there may be a risk of relegating his role to an equivalent channelling of Greek ideas into Arabic. This danger is accentuated by the fact that even many Arabists find al-Kindī's language strange and difficult to penetrate. Maybe some obscurity is inevitable for one like al-Kindī who worked at a time when the tradition of Arabic philosophy was beginning to find its feet. Terminology needs time to crystallise and idioms might not always be found to transfer the meaning of the source adequately. Furthermore, it might not always be apparent exactly which works were available to an author writing in such a situation. So Adamson's book plays the dual role of rescuing al-Kindī from the sidelines of philosophy in general and of presenting him to Arabic scholars and philosophers. It is also extremely accessible and, along with texts currently being co-translated by the author and meant as a companion to this volume, should open up study of al-Kindī as philosopher to many more students as well.

Although the purpose of the book is to explain and assess al-Kindī's philosophical ideas in their own right, the author is sensitive to the context in which al-Kindī worked and his importance for the philosophers who followed him. He includes a discussion of how al-Kindī and his circle created an Arabic philosophical vocabulary, much of which was retained and used by later philosophers although some of it fell out of use. As the first of the Islamic philosophers, it might be thought that al-Kindī would have had to contend with opponents to philosophy. However, Adamson explains that since al-Kindī lived at a time when philosophy had not yet been integrated into the Arab world he did not have to contend with entire schools of thought that objected to philosophy as a systematic discipline. Rather, because he and his circle introduced it through translations and original treatises, his job was to persuade his readers of the importance, relevance and truth of the Greek philosophical tradition. This he does with a sentiment often used to describe mediaeval philosophers' attitudes towards ideas and arguments that owe their origin to foreign cultures: 'we must not be ashamed to admire the truth, or to acquire it, from wherever it comes.' (23) Al-Kindī's use of Greek philosophy had its opponents, but his responses, as Adamson points out, show that they disagreed with his methods of using Greek philosophy in support of Islam rather than his theological conclusions, which were broadly in line with those of the theologians. Even so, the issue was important enough to warrant attempts to portray the Greek sciences as Arabic in origin.[1]

Writing a book like this also demands knowledge of the kinds of texts that were available to al-Kindī and how that might have influenced his understanding and use of Greek thought. Adamson's expertise in this regard comes to the fore in several respects. It allows him to assess the way in which the translation movement worked and the way in which al-Kindī innovated beyond the work of his peers:

the predilections and interests of al-Kindī and his patrons were reflected in the choice of texts to translate, and in the modifications made in the process of translation. But al-Kindī's own works often stray yet further from the original sources, rather than simply reproducing the already modified doctrines of the translations. (199)[2]

After a chapter looking at al-Kindī's life and influence, Adamson moves on to outlining the ways in which he adopts Aristotelian modes of argument. One particularly striking feature is al-Kindī's use of dilemmatic arguments. These set up dichotomies between different possibilities and examine each in turn, often through the use of further dichotomies. If, on further examination, the disjunct under discussion turns out to be impossible, one of the alternatives must be true instead. The following scheme is a simplified version of the way this works:

Either A or B must be true. If A is true, it follows that A1 or A2 must be true. But A1 and A2 are both impossible, so A is false. Therefore B is true.

Adamson provides a helpful explanation of the benefits and drawbacks of these kinds of arguments, showing that they seem to allow certain knowledge of the conclusion, but that they do not show why the conclusion is true, only that it must indeed be so. This kind of argument pervades al-Kindī's corpus and Adamson considers that his lack of access to the Posterior Analytics may have been a factor contributing to his fondness for it. Such dichotomous arguments are fairly common in later Arabic thought, and one wonders if al-Kindī's influence explains why.

The example that Adamson uses to explain what a dichotomous argument involves is also an argument for God's existence. A chapter on al-Kindī's metaphysics then follows, beginning from his best known treatise, On First Philosophy. Here al-Kindī deals with a topic for which he is particularly famous: the unity and existence of God. Through a series of steps he argues that since nothing can make itself there must be a maker of everything. There are three major theses for which al-Kindī argues: there is a cause of everything; it is the cause of other things' unity; it is completely unified in all respects. The final one leads to the claim that there can be no description of God since God is incomparable. As the principle of everything, God cannot be subsumed under the same genus as anything else. But this isn't simply a regular negative theology since al-Kindī wants to say more than that God is indescribable. He wants to say that God is one, and that God causes unity in all other things. What he seems to be doing here is cautioning against improper understandings of that claim. Unfortunately, only the first part of On First Philosophy survives.[3] The way Adamson deals with this problem is an example of how he meets one of the challenges facing studies of al-Kindī: how to contend with the eclectic nature of his extant writings. Throughout the book Adamson brings together disparate parts of al-Kindī's corpus in order to test hypotheses and suggest answers to problems. The rest of this chapter considers what al-Kindī meant by calling God the 'true agent', saying that God creates being from non-being, as the cause of unity, and explaining why creation must be temporal, a topic taken up in greater detail in the following chapter.

Whether the world is with or without beginning is a question that occupied many in later Arabic philosophy and became, at times, a controversial issue. Al-Kindī may have set the agenda for this debate when he supported the view that the world was created with a temporal beginning. Adamson argues that al-Kindī's concern probably arises from the disagreements of his time over whether the Qur'ān is created or eternal. In this context, one side argued that if it is eternal it cannot be differentiated from God's eternality. In order to secure the transcendence of God, and a correct answer to this question, al-Kindī would have been justified in generalising the argument to the entire created order. Much of this chapter is dedicated to the Greek background of al-Kindī's arguments, particularly the works of Philoponous who, like al-Kindī, opposed the Aristotelian view that the world had no beginning. Here too, however, Adamson convincingly argues that al-Kindī's arguments are more original than has previously been credited.

The chapter on al-Kindī's psychology can serve as an example of how al-Kindī attempted to contribute to the project of harmonising Greek philosophy with itself, as well as harmonising it with Islam. Questions of epistemology relate closely to the nature of religious and prophetic knowledge. Al-Kindī's view is that prophecy does not give extra truths beyond those gained through the intellect. Rather, a prophet gains the same knowledge more quickly. Prophetic texts also express the same knowledge but through different mediums that are appropriate for all, not only for philosophers. Philosophy can therefore be used to explicate the Qur'ān alongside other traditional exegetical methods. 'This is why I have spoken of his project as the integration of philosophy into Islamic and Arabic culture. Philosophy is not put forward as an alternative that is either superior or inferior to ongoing intellectual endeavors of al-Kindī's contemporaries. Rather it is offered as a new, powerful tool for achieving exactly the same aims, in concert with the indigenous disciplines that were developed in al-Kindī's day.' (45)

Al-Kindī argues that the soul is an incorporeal substance. He then goes on to say that the human soul is the intellect. Although the soul's other faculties work through the body, they are opposed to the soul itself since they are dependent upon the body, and the body is in competition with the soul. A problem then arises as to how it is possible to know things in the world if the senses distract the intellect, rather than inform it. Adamson explains that al-Kindī posits the existence of a separate intellect that is permanently active in order to explain how humans come to know intelligible things. Knowledge is derived, he says, from this first intellect rather than through the senses, as sensible things cannot be the basis of knowledge. Al-Kindī seems sometimes to indicate that although sensible objects are not themselves the objects of knowledge they could be a basis for knowledge because they reflect universals.

Studies of al-Kindī's ethics suffer from the fact that little of his material on the topic survives. He offers advice encouraging a highly ascetic way of life as part of a system virtually uninfluenced by Aristotelian ethics. In a chapter on ethics Adamson argues that, contrary to previously published opinions, there is no evidence that the major ethical work, On Dispelling Sadness, is merely a copy of a previous work. Here al-Kindī provides a response to the apparent disorder in human suffering, distinguishing between fleeting, material goods, which are distractions, and permanent intellectual goods. Distinctions drawn in the previous chapter between the theoretical intellect as the true nature of a person and the practical manifestations of the soul provide the background to al-Kindī's conclusions.

Adamson is surely correct when he says that an adequate treatment of al-Kindī's scientific works would require a book length study in its own right, though the most important issues are presented here. His chapter on al-Kindī's science focuses on the philosophical issues, though al-Kindī himself would not have accepted a distinction between science and philosophy. The overarching theme that Adamson uses to tie them together is al-Kindī's method, which is mathematical. Such a method accounts for how al-Kindī is able to say so much about the physical sciences, which depend upon empirical research, even though sensation is relatively unimportant in his epistemology. He does use empirical observation to confirm his theories and individual facts, but the mathematical nature of the sciences bear out a belief in the harmony of all things, to which sense evidence attests.

The final chapter concerns al-Kindī's cosmology. In most of his work he follows the standard Aristotelian views. However, he also develops some independent ones. In this connection, a particularly interesting treatise is On Rays, though there is some doubt as to whether it is authentically Kindian. Adamson weighs up the evidence and produces a powerful argument in favour of the view that it was written by al-Kindī, but with the qualification that it would have been written at a much later date than his other works on astral causes.[4] The main cause of sub-lunar motion is no longer seen to be friction caused by the various motions of the heavenly bodies, but, rather, the rays they emit. Like the earlier treatises, On Rays suggests causal determinism, but Adamson argues that al-Kindī's new theory is an attempt to develop a system that explains more of the celestial phenomena. It also reinforces the scientific basis for astrology that al-Kindī sought to establish. If the stars were to cause events in the sub-lunar world, it would be possible to predict those events on the basis of knowledge of the stars. Al-Kindī then has to deal with the question of how human choice might fit into such a scheme. Adamson proposes that since the immaterial soul is seen as theoretical, it is not necessarily incompatible with the claim that actions in the material realm are caused. Finally, although the stars are the proximate causes of worldly events, their ultimate cause is God, so the subject of this final chapter concerns providence, metaphysics and psychology, as well as cosmology, thus tying the book together neatly.

[1] Dimitri Gutas, Greek Thought, Arabic Culture (London: Routledge, 1998), p. 88.

[2] The author has previously published on al-Kindī's wider philosophical circle as well, most notably in The Arabic Plotinus: A Theological Study of the Theology of Aristotle (London: Duckworth, 2002).

[3] It has been translated by Alfred Ivry in Al-Kindi's Metaphysics (Albany: SUNY Press, 1974).

[4] This theory also provides a possible explanation of inconsistencies in the earlier chapter on 'Psychology', p. 134.