Alain Badiou: Live Theory

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Oliver Feltham, Alain Badiou: Live Theory, Continuum, 2008, 159pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826496935.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Any book about Alain Badiou by Oliver Feltham should be taken seriously. After all, he is the English translator of Badiou's monumental Being and Event. The current book, which is referred to on the back cover as an "introduction" to Badiou, is actually something else. It is a thematic chronology of his work. As such, it does not seek to replace Peter Hallward's Badiou: A Subject to Truth, which will likely remain the standard introductory reference text, but instead to open up other areas in Badiou's thought. These areas receive more cursory treatment in Hallward's book, because the latter concentrates on the period of Being and Event and its aftermath.

There is a dual thread Feltham follows throughout Badiou's work, the strands of which are entwined. Each of these strands is derived from puzzles that vexed the thought of Badiou's teacher Louis Althusser. One strand concerns the question of how to conceive political change; the other concerns the relation of theory and practice. The intertwining of these strands occurs around the issue of politics. A theory of change must somehow be enlightening for the engagement with political practice. On the other hand, one might ask how much practice itself can enlighten one's theoretical conception of politics and political change. For Badiou, who has never abandoned the field of engaged politics, these issues can be said to structure his thought. It seems to me that by placing them front and center, Feltham has touched on the heart of that thought.

On Althusser's structuralist Marxism, change is difficult to conceive. Since the elements of the structure are given, it seems that the best one might hope for is a rearrangement of those elements rather than the appearance of something new. This does not mean that Althusser himself had nothing to say about change. In fact, he focused, like Lenin, on the weak points in a particular structure as offering avenues for political transformation. However, the question persists of whether the change is really from one state to another or simply a reformation of the initial state. Feltham discusses this with reference to Aristotle's "productivist" view of change, which he sees underlying Althusser's approach to these issues.

Early in his career, Badiou turns to mathematics and in particular to the idea of mathematical modeling as a way around the productivist model of change. In The Concept of Model, he argues for a particular understanding of models. In Feltham's words, Badiou "shows how once the formal syntax has been constructed, the semantic field chosen and its variables assigned, one must then show that the axioms of the formal syntax still prove to be consistent within the chosen semantic field." (p. 23) This approach to modeling has at least two elements worth noting. First, it makes the model responsive to the field it seeks to model. A model is not simply a grid placed over a field, but something that must take the field into account. This will prove important in Badiou's second, Maoist period, when he asserts the primacy of practice over theory. Second, and related, it allows for changes in the model, transformations that enlarge the field of the model. Feltham points to the emergence of imaginary numbers as an example of such a transformation, and notes that there is a structural similarity between such transformations and the concept of a generic set in Being and Event.

At this point in the story, as with all French thinkers of this generation, one is forced to say in one way or another, "and then there was May '68." The particular effect on Badiou of the events of May and their aftermath is that he moves to embrace Maoism with its primacy of practice over theory. However, such a primacy itself leads to a question. If there is a primacy of practice, then how can one retain a Marxist overview of particular struggles? In other words, how do we conceive various local struggles as being part of a larger picture of revolutionary change? Here we can see the dual thread at work: the question of change and the relation of theory and practice. And in confronting these issues, the threats Badiou faces come, according to Feltham, from two sides. There is the spontaneism of the left, which abjures theory in favor of practice, and there is the dogmatism of the right, which would give the primacy to theory and see anything that does not follow the correct theoretical line as an unacceptable revisionism.

At this stage in his career, Badiou has recourse to the idea of the party as the unifier that both responds to and directs the masses in their various struggles. This, Feltham points out, is in sharp contrast to Badiou's later thought.

The massive difference, however, between these early calls for a new organizational logic and the work in Logiques des mondes is that in the latter it is not a matter of a pre-existing organization developing and rendering consistent ideas that emerge in a popular revolt, but of the a posteriori emergence of a new organization consequent to an event and as a movement of change. (p. 38)

Much of Feltham's reading of this period is focused on what might be called Badiou's first great work, Theory of the Subject (which is forthcoming in an English translation by Bruno Bosteels). In that work, Badiou creates two concepts, the offsite and the splace. The latter is, roughly, the dominant structure conceived in spatial terms, and the former that which does not fit into the splace but is nevertheless part of it: it is, as it were, off its site. What is crucial in this conception, however, is that a splace is always the result of a dialectical change. In other words, in order for there to be structure, there first has to be change. This is, in a way, an inversion of Althusser's structuralist Marxism, which gave primacy to structure over change.

At this point in his discussion, Feltham introduces three animals as metaphors for thematic concerns in Badiou's thought: the eagle, the old mole, and the owl. The eagle is the "voluntarist and idealist tendency in Badiou's thinking of change." (p. 57) It concerns those moments of his thought which seem to soar above history in order to break with it. The old mole, by contrast, is the voice that emerges when Badiou takes on the details of history in order to study the real dialectical changes they produce. Finally, the owl is the pragmatic realist: it sees change as inevitable, one way or another. In Feltham's view, all three voices find their way into Badiou's thought, starting from Theory of the Subject and running through the later works. Cast in terms of Being and Event, there is the Badiou of the event and the rupture, the Badiou of the slow forcing of the evental site, and the Badiou of the generic that always rearranges the character of a situation.

Turning to Being and Event, Feltham characterizes it as introducing an important break from the second, Maoist period. This break involves the removal of Marxist elements of the previous period of his thought. "What he subtracts is the entire Marxist framework for the analysis of politics and history: he no longer speaks of a dialectical process of history, of the party, of proletarian ideology or contradiction." (p. 84) The overview he offers of Being and Event will be familiar to those with a background in Badiou's thought. There is a clear, if quick, rendering of Badiou's appropriation of set theory, the event, forcing, and the generic. Feltham glosses the mathematical character of these ideas, which is probably necessary for a book of this size and orientation. Moreover, this area has already been covered by Hallward's book, so there would be no necessity to repeat it. What is of particular interest here is Feltham's response to the charge of voluntarism leveled at Badiou. This is the objection that the event, since it is a break with one's historical situation, does not emerge from the dynamic of the situation itself, dialectically or otherwise, but from a pure decision by those involved with the event, what Badiou calls the militants of an event. It is the primacy of the eagle over the old mole. Feltham's defense against this objection is that what the militants of an event do is not rightly characterized as an ex nihilo break from a situation. It is instead a wager that there is something lying beneath the situation that has yet to find expression. In Badiou's thought, an evental site -- the site from which an event can emerge -- covers a void in the situation. But the void is only for the situation; it is not an ontological void. In set theoretical terms, the evental site is "an entirely abnormal multiple: that is, a multiple such that none of its elements are presented in the situation." (Being and Event, tr. Oliver Feltham, London: Continuum, 2006, p. 174) What the militants of an event seek is the expression of those elements in the name of the event rather than a pure break that would come entirely from outside the situation.

One might want to object here that there is still a voluntarism at work in Badiou's thought inasmuch as the theory of change he proposes does not see change as arising organically out of the character of the situation itself. This, however, I would argue is one of the virtues of his thought. It re-introduces the concept of agency into political change, without seeing that agency as entirely ungrounded in the situation. If there is to be political change, at some point people must decide to resist the situation they find themselves in, and do so in the name of something else. It is the distinction of Badiou's thought -- as well as that of his fellow theorist Jacques Rancière -- to have reintroduced this idea into French progressive political thought, and to have done so without resorting to any commitment to radical free will characteristic of some of the existentialists (e.g., Jean-Paul Sartre) with whom it had previously been associated.

Alain Badiou: Live Theory is a valuable book for those of us struggling to grasp the thematic trends in Badiou's thought. Those approaching it would likely be better served with some background in that thought, since there are a number of moments that seem to presuppose a familiarity with the issues discussed. However, given the originality of the work and Feltham's ability to keep the chronological trajectory of Badiou's thought before us, this book (which also contains a brief interview with Badiou at the end) is an important addition to the literature on this increasingly influential philosophical voice.