Alexius Meinong, The Shepherd of Non-Being

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Dale Jacquette, Alexius Meinong, The Shepherd of Non-Being, Springer, 2015, 434pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319180748.

Reviewed by Frederick Kroon, The University of Auckland


In this collection of papers spanning some twenty years, Dale Jacquette admits to a single overarching aim: "to explore the prospects for a Meinongian approach to philosophical logic and semantics that is different from … Fregean referential extensionalism in contemporary analytic philosophy". The idea of such a collection is welcome. It is now widely agreed that Meinong is a metaphysician whose work needs to be taken seriously, and Jacquette is a well-known figure in the rehabilitation of Meinong. Inevitably, there are gaps. It wasn't clear in the end, for example, how some of the things Jacquette says fit his version of Meinongian logic. But there is a far more frustrating gap, at least in the eyes of this reviewer. Jacquette uses his Introduction to describe his commitment to Meinongianism and to decry what he sees as the continuing and pernicious influence of extensionalist semantics. But something seemed to be missing here. I will identify one of the missing elements -- the most serious -- later; the other, which is not unrelated, I can simply identify as Jacquette's failure in this Introduction to reflect critically on his own project. It would have been good to hear Jacquette say more about his own struggles in trying to construct a coherent Meinongian framework. For there were difficulties; in fact, these essays exhibit certain shifts in his view that reflect these difficulties, and it would have been good to know where he now stands and whether he sees new challenges for his brand of Meinongianism.

This is a long book. It is also rather repetitive, a consequence of its being a collection of separate papers, most of them previously published but left unchanged for this collection; many of them contain near-identical expository remarks, accompanied by near-identical notes of irritation (about bad old extensionalist semantics) and triumphalism (about the rise of a successful intensionalist Meinongian semantics). But a clear benefit of the repetition is that we are left in little doubt about Jacquette's target and his preferred version of Meinongianism. Jacquette, like Meinong, repudiates the assimilation of objects to existent objects, or, more generally, to objects that have being, an assimilation whose most influential proponent was Quine in 'On What There Is'. Numerous objects don't have any sort of being or Sein; but they can, for all that, still have properties, in particular the properties that make them what they are, or their Sosein. The golden mountain has being a mountain and being golden as its Sosein, Hamlet has being a prince of Denmark as part of his Sosein, and so on. Neither has existence as part of its Sosein, since for Meinong and, following him, Jacquette, any object whatsoever has the properties that belong to its Sosein and none of the listed objects has existence as a property. This is testament to the fact that existence and being golden or being a prince of Denmark are very different sorts of properties. The latter are constitutive or nuclear properties, the former extra-constitutive or extra-nuclear, their possession by an object somehow supervening on the object's constitutive properties.

What determines the full extent of the set of objects? Jacquette is pretty clear on this. Any combination of constitutive properties determines an object, which is the way he construes Meinong's principle of Unrestricted Freedom of Assumption. This threatens contradiction, as Russell saw with the case of the round square. Jacquette accepts a solution also proposed by Richard Routley: being square, the round square is both round and non-round, but we can't then infer that it is not round since 'x is not P ⇔ x is non-P' is only logically true when P is extra-constitutive. What then about Russell's existent round square? Here we need to recall that, for Jacquette, Unrestricted Freedom of Assumption is restricted to constitutive properties. Existence is extra-constitutive, so it can't be combined with other properties to constitute the Sosein of a new object, and hence Russell's problem doesn't arise. This is one of the few points where Jacquette admits to departing from Meinong (but see below). Meinong accepted the idea of watered-down constitutive surrogates of extra-constitutive properties and was prepared to say that the existent round square is existent (where being existent is a watered-down property), even though it doesn't exist. Meinong thought that the claim that a thing is existent lacks what he called the modal moment, and that the modal moment was needed to ensure the thing's full existence. Jacquette mounts a kind of regress argument against this idea (p. 100).

I said earlier that the book is long. But it is also rich in ideas, as a quick run-though of the various chapters shows. The first four are the most historical, and include useful accounts of Meinong's life and philosophy, the origins of object theory, how the phenomenology of assumption gets Meinong to object theory, and the nature of Aussersein. If nothing else, these chapters show Jacquette to be an extremely thorough Meinong expositor. Next we have part-expository chapters whose aim is to defend Meinong's ideas in detail: a chapter on the constitutive/extraconstitutive distinction, on the Meinong-Russell debate about the golden mountain, and on Meinong's concept of implexive being. (There is also a chapter on domain comprehension in Meinong's object theory, but this seems an outlier, in the sense that the views it presents are radically at odds with other things Jacquette says -- for example, it assigns an important place to the idea of the modal moment and allows an object's Sosein to contain extraconstitutive properties. Jacquette doesn't make it clear in this collection whether we should now take these to be his considered views on the matter or just take them as more or less promising suggestions. Given the difficulties they face, I suspect the latter, and here I will simply disregard them.)

Next come a number of chapters that are more applied in focus, including a chapter on understanding the notion of nothing(ness) as a Meinongian object (quirky but sort of fun) and how to reduce Edward N. Zalta's two modes of predication to Meinong's two kinds of properties (Jacquette suggests using a special relation of attribution, rather like the ascription relation Peter van Inwagen introduced in 1977 for the case of fictional characters). Completing this quartet of applied chapters are two whose positions strike me as more obvious: how to understand Tarskian quantificational semantics in Meinongian terms, making the result safe from a critique like John Etchemendy's, and how Russell's account of relations as existent universals can be rendered in neutral Meinongian terms. This is followed by two chapters on the (more or less overtly) anti-Meinongian approaches to fiction of Lewis and Kripke, followed by two somewhat curious stand-alone chapters, the first a defense of Meinong's subjectivism about aesthetic value (a somewhat puzzling chapter, since Meinong's own mature view was an interesting and sophisticated version of objectivism) and the second an attempt to understand quantum indeterminacy as an instance of Meinongian predicational incompleteness. The last two chapters are lighter: an account of Jacquette's development as a Meinongian logician, followed by a brief and by now unsurprising reprise of the theme of Meinongian neglect and rediscovery. Completing the book is an appendix containing Jacquette's translations (plus commentaries) of two papers by Ernst Mally that discuss the latter's theory of determinations as it stood in 1908 (roughly speaking, his theory of properties, and his distinction between formal or constitutive and extra-formal or extraconstitutive properties).

There is much in Jacquette's book that will be of interest and value to readers of Meinong. But I also think the book rather oversells its message of neglect and rediscovery. Let me begin by highlighting what I see as the main missing element in Jacquette's presentation. Jacquette tends to portray himself as a lone figure "laboring in the Meinongian vineyard", still encountering opposition to Meinong's beingless objects that is, "if anything, as virulent today as 30 years ago when [he] became persuaded of the need for a Meinongian counterbalance to a predominantly contemporary referentially extensionalist logic and semantics" (p. 380). But that is not how the outside world sees current interest in Meinongian ideas. The problem of how to understand claims of nonexistence now occupy center stage in philosophy, and criticisms of Russell's account of such claims and claims about the nonexistent in general are rife. Meinong is seen as one of the early and most important contributors to this debate. Nor is Quine seen as the unrivalled hero of analytic-style metaphysics and ontology he once was. Many now prefer to side more with Carnap on questions of ontology, sharing a certain relaxed take on ontology that would have been anathema to Quine (see especially the growing literature on metaontology and metametaphysics). Relatedly, many logicians and philosophers now think that quantifiers need not be existentially loaded. To see in such developments the continued muscle-flexing of "referentially extensionalist logic and semantics" would seem bizarre. It is of course true that relatively few of the many philosophers who work in these areas would self-identify as Meinongian, but neither would they disown Meinongianism quite in the way Kripke did in his John Locke lectures. The field has simply matured, and Meinongianism is one of the options, if not one of the more popular options.

I suspect that one reason that Jacquette doesn't buy this is that he doesn't see much of a sign of this more relaxed attitude. In this he may be right, but for a reason that deserves highlighting. When Jacquette writes about being a lone figure "laboring in the Meinongian vineyard" his description of the vineyard quickly reveals that he is talking about Meinongianism as Jacquette understands it -- a view committed to a domain of objects that reflect a principle of comprehension restricted only by the nature of the properties that figure in it (they must be constitutive properties), where these objects literally have the properties that thus identify them, and where many of the objects are therefore nonexistent since no existent thing has their identifying or constitutive properties. This may have been Meinong's own view, but why interpret the Meinongian project so narrowly? Mally himself thought there was another way to develop Meinong's object theory, with his work on this alternative way of understanding the role of determinations appearing just a few years after the papers in the Appendix. Zalta later developed the few hints Mally offers into a powerful logical framework that accepts two modes of predication in place of two kinds of properties. Despite Jacquette's urgings, I see nothing remotely amiss in construing this as a Meinongian or neo-Meinongian perspective. It is easy enough to divest the framework of the Platonist cloak Zalta often dresses it in, if the Platonism is what worries Jacquette. Meinong might well not have accepted such a view, but we have already seen that Jacquette himself departs from Meinong in ways the latter would have decried.

Jacquette may of course insist that his (neo-) Meinongianism is the logical and semantic framework version we get to by making minimal revisions to Meinong's actual views, and that it is the only one adequately supported by argument. But that is doubtful, to say the least. Jacquette's brand of Meinongianism faces problems that some other versions don't face. In particular, a growing number of Meinong-sympathizers now think the constitutive/extraconstitutive distinction is simply untenable. In particular, it seems obvious that ordinary predicates like 'being golden', 'being a mountain', 'being a clever detective living in London', and so on, are existence-entailing (see especially Graham Priest's Towards Non-Being). For consider. Suppose we agree that being physical and located in space and time suffices for something to exist. But it is a conceptual truth that if x is a mountain or if x is a detective living (living!) in London then x is physical and located in space and time. Secondly, if a character in the Holmes stories had said to Holmes 'You are a clever detective, but you don't exist', Holmes would have regarded this as the most elementary of falsehoods. Of course, this is not to say that Holmes or the golden mountain really exists; it is just to remind us of the magnitude of the problem we face in accounting for this.

To his credit, Jacquette grapples with this problem in various chapters. He thinks that while existence is an extraconstitutive property, the converse intentional property of being described in the story as existing is constitutive (p. 106). But this surely gets things the wrong way round. If anything, this is a property of Holmes external to the stories and so should be extraconstitutive. What is constitutive of Holmes is how Doyle characterizes him, not that Doyle characterizes him a certain way. Saying the latter confuses different levels of description.

If we are nonetheless inclined to make this move, we have now given ourselves every reason to regard a property of the form being described or characterized in X as F as somehow more fundamental than the property of simply being F, where the question of whether a thing really is F is not decided by whether it is described in X as F. And then we are close to a Meinongian view that places a lot of store on just this distinction -- the Modal Meinongianism of Graham Priest and Franz Berto according to which objects (only) have their characterizing properties at worlds where the objects really are the way they are characterized as being. The fact that Jacquette's own struggles come close to nudging him in such a direction suggests once again that Jacquette is unwise to insist on understanding Meinongianism in the circumscribed way he does.

There are other things that will frustrate readers of this book. Some of the arguments on behalf of Jacquette's brand of Meinongianism or against the (Meinongian and anti-Meinongian) opposition are simply too swift to be credible. For example, Jacquette claims to offer a logical criterion for distinguishing nuclear from extranuclear properties by invoking the internal vs. external negation distinction: thus, F is extraconstitutive if for all x (x is not F ↔ x is non-F), and F is constitutive otherwise. (Jacquette's own formal version (C) on p. 97 is too weak, saying only that some constitutive property is like this.) But no logician ought to be content with such a characterization. Intuitions about when we can go from 't is non-F' to 't is not F' are notoriously slippery and are for many best explained in pragmatic terms. Furthermore, an account of the distinction ought at the very least to reveal a clear sense in which 't is non-F' excludes 't is F'. (Russell's account of scope distinctions is a paradigm of how to do this.) In short, it is hard to see how such a "logical criterion" advances matters at all (and hard to see how converse intentional properties like being described by X as F get to count as constitutive on this criterion).

A second example of an argument that is simply too swift is Jacquette's argument against Kripke's work on fiction. While Jacquette is right to chastise Kripke for his throwaway comments about Meinong, much of Jacquette's own discussion is blighted by his misunderstanding of the position he attacks. Kripke does not suggest that readers "pretend that names or Kripkean characters . . . solve crimes" (p. 311). For Kripke Conan Doyle pretends to be relating facts about a real person called 'Holmes', while readers pretend that they are reading about the exploits of such a person when they pick up a copy of one of the Holmes stories. This is what Evans calls 'existentially creative' pretense since it is not about some antecedently given object. (The creation of Kripkean fictional characters comes at a later reflective stage.) Here we again have a case where Jacquette seems to think that all roads point to the kind of Meinongian theory he prefers, but where the real dialectical situation is far more complex.

A final point about presentation. There were a surprisingly large number of typographical and other errors, some of which were duplicated from earlier versions of the chapters, reinforcing the view that the papers should have been edited prior to publication in book format. For me one of the most unsettling occurred in the Appendix, where Jacquette persistently conflates 'formal' and 'extraconstitutive' (for Mally a property is 'formal' if it is constitutive or follows from a constitutive property), and reports Mally as holding that, among other things, the properties of being existent, impossible, etc, "are properly characterized as formal, extraconstitutive or extranuclear" while "the properties entering into an object's Sosein are exclusively extra-formal or extraconstitutive". The net effect of these mistakes is that the reader can't help but wonder whether other errors of transcription occurred in Jacquette's actual translations of Mally.