Alienation after Derrida

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Simon Skempton, Alienation after Derrida, Continuum, 2010, 234pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441104748.

Reviewed by Michael Marder, Duquesne University/University of Lisbon


It is no secret that contemporary philosophy is under the spell of the Other. A host of rather automatic, ethico-political associations follows the invocations of "otherness" like a comet-tail: hospitality, respect, tolerance, diversity, multiculturalism, etc. We are urged to come to terms with that which is alien, to learn to live with foreignness, to recognize the uncanny -- in Freud's vernacular, the "strangely familiar" -- within us, to derive our very sense of identity from alterity. The approaches to alterity, in turn, may be broadly classified into those that are purely formal in their refusal to endow the Other with determinate features or objective characteristics and those that fill it with concrete, infinitely variable content, depending on the Other's race, sex, gender, economic status, and so on. Still, regardless of the elected framework and of the qualifier "radical" often attached to it, "otherness" is domesticated not only as a hegemonic concept that, rather than awakening, brings critical thinking to a halt, but also as a bearer of intransigent humanism, willing to confer this title on no being other than human. Although the current theoretical interest in animal alterities goes a long way toward undoing such domestication, it is ultimately insufficient for the purpose of questioning the hegemonic status of the Other.

What is required, in addition to a thorough de-humanization of the concept, is its historicization thanks to a sound philosophical genealogy, extending all the way back to the ancient Greek heteron and, more recently, to Hegel's dialectics. To understand the current emphasis on alterity, we ought to situate it within the current "trans-valuation of values," as Nietzsche puts it, where the highest -- from the metaphysical standpoint -- values are debased and the lowest elevated, that is to say, where the same, the proper, and the identical cede their privileged place to the other, the alien, and the non-identical. This lopsided dialectic indicates, however, that the Nietzschean trans-valuation is far from being complete: in its second stage, at the threshold of which we find ourselves today, it will necessitate a de-hierarchization of the already inverted values, so that alterity, too, would lose its newly acquired transcendental status, just as sameness and identity did in twentieth-century thought. The promise of deconstruction lies, precisely, in its ability to inspire this post-metaphysical thrust "beyond the same and the other."

Simon Skempton glimpses the promise of deconstruction in the fifth (and final) chapter of his book, dedicated to "Deconstructive De-alienation." Despite a token tribute to alterity, the other and the same trade places so vertiginously in his text that the metaphysical distinction is wholly transformed, if not leveled. For example:

Alienation is the effacement of this instituting activity, of différance, through the latter's objectification … This is an alienation of subjectivity insofar as subjectivity is the opening to the other. Thus alienation is a suppression of otherness, and de-alienation is then an opening to and welcoming of the other. This may seem paradoxical, as it means that alienation suppresses alienness and de-alienation welcomes the alien. (170)

The core argument of Alienation after Derrida hinges on aligning différance -- the difference from and the deferral of identity -- with "inalienable alienation" (4), which has been, traditionally, covered over and disavowed by the metaphysical yearning for originary wholeness and purity. This disavowal is the reason why classical critiques of alienation, relying upon the myth of an undisturbed, paradisiacal, originary unity, are read as "the effacement … of différance," while deconstructive de-alienation is invested with the positive function of affirming that which has been effaced. But it is also the reason why theories of alienation have become outmoded in the second half of the twentieth century, after the metaphysics of presence and of the proper had been relentlessly debunked, first and foremost by deconstruction itself. The anachronism of a return to alienation in the aftermath of its discrediting as a philosophical fiction is at the heart of this study, which wishes to carve out a niche for the concept already processed by the deconstructive machinery and, thus, purged of metaphysical overtones.

Aside from re-interpreting alienation in the post-deconstructive vein, i.e., circling back to and affirming the object of deconstructive criticism after it has been "deconstructed," Alienation after Derrida implicitly commits to 1) enhancing our understanding of the classical notion of alienation, 2) shedding light on Derrida's engagement with German Idealism, and 3) contributing to the interpretation of Derrida's vast oeuvre. The goal of this review is to assess to what extent the book lives up to its multiple commitments, in staging the encounter between deconstruction and one of the most metaphysically charged concepts in the history of philosophy.

Although in the analyses of Hegel, Marx, and Heidegger composing the three central chapters of his study, Skempton attempts -- often painstakingly -- to distinguish alienation from various related terms, including objectification, reification, or externalization, he erases this very distinction in the discussions of Derrida's critique of this phenomenon. Deconstructive de-alienation that emerges out of the juxtaposition of German philosophy and Derrida's writings is fixated on the singularity and the "whoness" of the de-alienated subject, having dispensed with its generality and "whatness." Skempton, to be sure, suggests that "In Derrida's writings there are two conceptions of singularity, one dependent of the proper and the other radically detached from it" (13), and it is this second, improper kind of singularity that he is going to rescue for the sake of de-alienation. When it comes to embracing "whoness," however, no such qualifications are made; categorically stated, "Derrida conceives the personal on the basis of singularity and thinghood on the basis of generality… . The 'who' must always be other." (16) It follows, in keeping with Skempton's logic, that de-alienation entails the liberation of human beings from their objectivating designation as a "what" and a recovery (however impossible) of their singularity, untranslatable into any external and general characteristics. At the very least, then, the author presents deconstruction's approach to the issue of alienation as much more impoverished and reductive than that of the tradition wherein the term first germinated, if, indeed, this approach renders the concept in question synonymous with reification.

Let us note, nonetheless, that Skempton's account of deconstruction is deeply flawed. If the tension of différance is to be maintained, the subject will have to waver between pure singularity and generality, as well as between whatness and whoness, so that each extreme will differ from, defer, be differed, and deferred by the other. Rather than opt for the subject's "whoness," Derrida, in texts ranging from Signsponge and Glas to Specters of Marx, posits it within the disjunction of "who or what," supplementing this move with the description of the thing as the most general and the most singular, as the personal and the impersonal, and as something that, consequently, wreaks havoc in the categorizations of proper and common names. Nor is singularity a simple "dislocating disjuncture in the field of presence," as Skempton asserts, contrasting it to différance, which is "said to dislocate the singular itself in a chain of substitutability" (156); on the contrary, it is the singularity embedded in and emanating from each possibility of repeating the same, which Derrida terms "iterability." What would alienation look like against the background of this deconstructive suspension of the aspiration toward singularity and whoness? What is the place of generality and whatness in the de-alienated condition? Virtually slotting Derrida, who turns out to be indistinguishable from Levinas, into the German philosophical tradition, Skempton loses sight of these questions and, instead, defines de-alienation as "a re-subjectification, a de-objectification that brings the subject back to its non-phenomenal, non-present, undetermined basis." (199)

The predilection for a single pole in a dichotomous opposition marks Alienation after Derrida with remarkable consistency. In addition to his endorsement of the non-phenomenal, indeed noumenal, view of subjectivity as pure indeterminacy, Skempton equates the an-economic exception to the economic order with the logic of ends in themselves (123) and sovereign decisions with the possibility of praxis (168). In each case, de-alienation becomes tantamount to a recovery of a particular pole in the dichotomies of presence and absence, activity and passivity, subjectivity and objectivity, and so on -- the recovery that is not at all at odds with the project of Enlightenment humanism. Needless to say, such a method is not only formal but also inconsistent with the spirit, if not the letter, of deconstruction, which is only possible thanks to an indeterminate oscillation between two (or more) determinate alternatives.

Similarly formal and reductive is the treatment of deconstruction as synonymous with différance, thus transformed into a master-concept, Derrida's first and last word in philosophy. In the brief outline of the intellectual history of alienation presented in Chapter 1, différance functions as the exclusive point of contact between Plotinus, Rousseau, Schiller, the German Romantics, Schelling, Hegel, Feuerbach, Stirner, Marx, and Lukács, on the one hand, and deconstruction, on the other. While later Derridian figures and tropes, such as the trace and the specter, are mentioned in passing throughout the book, the term that should have received the most attention in a discussion of alienation -- namely, the gift -- is conspicuously absent. The analysis of the gift would have been especially germane to a re-evaluation of the relationship between Hegel and Derrida, undertaken in Chapter 2. In the scheme of Hegel's Philosophy of Right, the gift is a deficient form of exchange, whereby the alienation of property is not mutual but one-sided, so that the alienating party's loss is the receiving party's gain. But, in Given Time and The Gift of Death, Derrida raises the gift to the level of the absolute and wholly unpredictable generosity, which dispenses the best and the worst outside of the closed circuits of economic calculations and intersubjective recognition. No analysis of the Derridian an-economy can do without a patient consideration of how this break with "restricted economy" freezes the dialectics of exchange or of the mutual alienation of property, and, by the same token, elevates what is but a vanishing moment in the Hegelian system (i.e., the gift) to the dignity of the mode of relating to alterity.

Unbridled formalism also governs Skempton's analysis of Derrida's reading of Marx (Chapter 3). In a telling passage, Skempton writes:

a more apposite inference from what he [Michael Ryan] and Derrida have to say about the infinite excess of exchange and surplus value is that capitalism itself is deconstruction. Indeed, money itself has the emptily formal, insubstantial and excessive quality of différance. (98)

It would be fair to say that, as soon as différance is reduced to nothing but an "emptily formal, insubstantial and excessive" principle, its comparison to money becomes plausible, disregarding the fact that the abstract monetary value is a leveling and homogenizing force, as Marx himself noted in Capital. The excess of surplus value is, actually, the embodiment of economic alienation (of the workers from their labor time not restituted in wages) and, therefore, the element of injustice, around which capitalism is built. There is no place either for singularity, or for justice, or for the incalculable in the machinations of the capitalist "excess of exchange," incompatible with deconstruction.

The repeated accusation that Derrida practices a garden variety of philosophical formalism crops up again in Chapter 4, examining deconstruction's debt to Heidegger. Having established that, according to Derrida, the remnants of metaphysics in Heidegger's corpus revolve around the questions of the proper and the authentic, Skempton wishes to undermine this charge:

Heidegger's philosophy bears a merely formal resemblance to metaphysics … It is not a metaphysics, because its fundamental concept is not a primal entity, but simply being as such. Heidegger is compelled to use the language of metaphysics, he has no other language at his disposal [sic], in order to get at something more fundamental than metaphysics. To attack him for being metaphysical, as Derrida does, is to be guilty of formalism. (133-4, emphasis added)

It is, however, advisable not to conflate the reasons behind Derrida's "attack" on Heidegger, which is not due to an interpretation of Being as a variation on the metaphysical "primal entity" (such as the Ideas, God, or even will-to-power) but, rather, due to Dasein's heroic being-toward-death, taking hold of mortality, finitude, and Being as, in each case, mine and not the other's. While Derrida is well aware of Heidegger's departure from the objectivist metaphysics of the past, he still treats the metaphysics of the ownmost, the proper, and the inalienable -- complicated by the inappropriable character of death, which renders Dasein irreplaceable and unique -- with extreme suspicion. The formal analogy with the "primal entities" in the history of philosophy has little bearing upon the Derridian critique of Heidegger, keenly attuned to the fine grain of the latter's text.

As the above brief discussion of formalism indicates, the weakest points of Alienation after Derrida are the oversimplifications and ready-made conceptual molds into which it forces deconstruction and, to a lesser extent, the work of key figures in German philosophy. We should remember, nevertheless, that one of the ongoing tasks for the second stage of the trans-valuation of all values is to re-interpret the previously rejected concepts of metaphysics. Given that "alienation" is a paradigm case of such paleonyms, or "old names," that despite their archaic ring demand to be heard anew after deconstruction, Skempton's endeavor is both laudable and timely.