All for Nothing: Hamlet's Negativity

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Andrew Cutrofello, All for Nothing: Hamlet's Negativity, MIT Press, 2014, 226pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780262526340.

Reviewed by Richard Gaskin, University of Liverpool


This book appears in a series called 'short circuits' the aim of which, its general editor tells us, is to use Lacanian psychoanalysis to 'illuminate a standard text or ideological formation, making it readable in a totally new way' (p. ix). The book certainly fulfils that expectation: it charts allusions to and uses of Shakespeare's Hamlet in early modern and modern philosophers, focusing on five aspects of Hamlet's negativity: his melancholy, his negative faith, his nihilism, his tarrying, and his fictional non-existence. The book is written throughout with verve and panache, and it certainly makes one think. What it makes me think is that the whole business of marrying philosophy and literature is much more difficult and delicate than is generally appreciated by the would-be matchmakers. Time and again, Andrew Cutrofello points out a suggestive connection -- a 'short circuit' -- that wouldn't normally occur to philosophers or literary critics working along their narrow lines. That is, of course, in itself a valuable contribution. But he always leaves the reader -- at least, this reader -- dissatisfied; he always leaves a lingering taste of 'so what?'. In a sense this is not a criticism of Cutrofello: it would be rough to complain that his suggestiveness never takes us very far, when going further is both very difficult and hardly ever attempted, let alone successfully executed, by anyone.

Let me give an example of what I mean: this is, I think, a typical instance of what happens repeatedly in this book. Cutrofello considers a wide range of philosophers who have had something to say about Hamlet in particular and Shakespeare in general, not just the usual 'continentalist' suspects (I scare quote, because the label is of course an egregious misnomer), but also such analytic philosophers as Russell and Brandom. In Russell's case, he discusses the problematic of false belief. Russell liked to use Othello's mistaken suspicion that Desdemona loved Cassio as an illustration of such a belief, and the philosophical problem that confronted Russell was how coherently to characterize this belief when its apparent object, that Desdemona loves Cassio, might be thought not to exist. How can a belief be directed onto nothing? This is of course an ancient problem, going back to Parmenides and Plato in the Theaetetus and Sophist.

My view is that there is such an entity as that Desdemona loves Cassio: it is a something rather than a nothing -- after all, it is the meaning of the declarative sentence 'Desdemona loves Cassio' -- and that meaning surely exists; indeed that Desdemona loves Cassio is a state of affairs, but it is a non-obtaining state of affairs, and we must simply accept this sort of thing as a basic ontological category. Russell embraced such a view earlier on in his career, but quickly abandoned it. In the course of ruminations over two decades at the beginning of the twentieth century, he developed various responses, culminating in the so-called 'multiple relation theory of judgement', which he then, characteristically, likewise abandoned.

Cutrofello describes that theory, in its application to the case of Othello, Desdemona, and Cassio, correctly enough (p. 133), but he then leaves the matter there. My question is then: so what? What do we gain by observing that Russell's illustration for his multiple relation theory of judgement is (a) a fictional example, and (b) the particular case of Othello's belief in Desdemona's (non-obtaining) love for Cassio? As someone with interests in both the analytic philosophy of language and the philosophy of literature, I feel strongly drawn to the hypothesis that there must be something interesting and helpful to say about this case, and about many others that one might cite and which Cutrofello mentions -- that is, that there must be something interesting and helpful to say about the connection in Russell's example between its literariness and its philosophical point. But what is there to say? Suppose someone objected as follows: 'Russell's example is just that. He chose it because he liked Shakespeare, assumed a general familiarity with the major plays, and wanted a piquant illustration to liven up what is otherwise a quite dry topic. But he could equally well have chosen either another (and less interesting) fictional example, or a real-life example of a false belief, say involving a well-known politician such as Lloyd-George'. I have nothing wherewith to counter such an objection, and so far as I can see Cutrofello offers nothing either. But if the objector is right, then the literary aspect of Othello's belief in Desdemona's supposed love of Cassio is just adventitious to the problem of falsity.

This connects with a thought that one often finds oneself entertaining when one reads philosophy in the 'continentalist' tradition, namely that it is focusing on trivia, and that the real action lies elsewhere. The real action, for an analytic philosopher, concerning Russell's multiple relation theory of judgement is whether that theory is right, whether it is true. The particular examples that Russell uses to illustrate his theory are neither here nor there, and are interchangeable with other examples -- indeed with the most unliterary and most boring examples you care to think of. Analytic philosophers are also, of course, interested in why Russell held his theory, and why and how he segued from one theory of judgement to the next, but these interests are ultimately subordinate to a concern with getting clear on the nature of falsity in its own right.

We are interested in Russell's intellectual story because it can tell us interesting things about the problem itself. After all, and apart from anything else, we want to acquaint ourselves with that story in order to avoid simply repeating in ignorance moves (and perhaps mistakes) that he has already made. 'Continentalist' philosophers, by contrast, always seem to clock out before the real issue gets going; usually they take their bow with a knowing smirk, as though there were something naïve, infantile, unsophisticated about the analytic philosopher's occupation with truth as such, as opposed to what so-and-so says about what so-and-so says about . . . what Heidegger said about truth. But to show no interest in the truth in its own right is to fail to take those philosophers, including Heidegger, who are still considered worth reading, seriously; for they wanted to get things right, and a proper respect for their endeavour would imply a similar interest in the present-day philosopher and interpreter. Reading past philosophy should never be a purely historical exercise.

Moreover, when 'continentalist' philosophers move into analytic terrain and try to finesse the clod-hopping efforts of their analytic congeners with elegant literary pirouettes, there is always the risk of coming a cropper. Cutrofello, though defter in this regard than most that I have seen, also occasionally falls down, as when he discusses Russell's theory of description and theory of types. We are told that

denoting phrases of the form "the such-and-such" . . . denote objects only when they can be expanded into true propositions of the form "There is one and only one entity that has the property of being such-and-such". When this cannot be accomplished, sentences containing a phrase of the form "the such-and-such" are generally false. (p. 118)

But unfortunately this is a muddle: according to Russell's theory, denoting phrases are incomplete expressions, and so do not denote objects at all, period. In context, the expansion Cutrofello mentions is always possible, and such sentences are false just if either (i) there is no such relevant entity or (ii) there is such an entity, but it does not have the property ascribed to it in the relevant sentence. Again, the theory of types is misunderstood (p. 128).

Perhaps surprisingly (or perhaps not), Cutrofello has relatively little to say about the interpretation of Hamlet itself; it occurs as a common point of reference, but is rarely discussed in its own right. The main exception to this is an extended treatment of Hamlet's supposed delay (ch. 4). Cutrofello argues that it is better to speak of his 'tarrying' than of his 'delaying'. Why? The idea is that tarrying is a more positive activity than delaying. If you delay, you omit to do something you should do, whereas if you tarry, there is no such implication: you may be engaged in a pastime, that is, in some activity (or inactivity) that valorizes the passage of time as such, as when, in a Platonic text to which Cutrofello refers (pp. 87-88), Socrates and Theaetetus and Theodorus linger lovingly over dialectical niceties because, unlike lawyers who are harried by the clock, 'we have plenty of time, haven't we?' (Theaetetus, 172c2). This is an interesting proposal: the problem with it is surely that Hamlet himself would disagree. He thinks he is delaying, not merely tarrying:

I do not know

Why yet I live to say this thing's to do

Sith I have cause, and will, and strength, and means

To do't. (IV. 4. 43-6)

So it is not clear to me that there is anything wrong with the traditional construal.

It is interesting to compare Cutrofello's book with a recent effort on Shakespeare by an analytic philosopher, Colin McGinn's Shakespeare's Philosophy (New York: Harper, 2006). In one respect McGinn's book is clearly inferior: he has read almost none of the vast secondary literature on Shakespeare, and makes almost no allusion to the responses of the philosophical tradition to Shakespeare's works. In both these respects, but especially in the second, Cutrofello's book far outstrips McGinn's in its scholarly virtues. Cutrofello has really done his homework before putting pen to paper, or finger to keyboard, and intriguing facts and connections and intertextualities leap from every page of All For Nothing: that, as I have said, is the book's great strength. McGinn, by contrast, gives the impression of having read through Shakespeare's major plays, once, and then dashed off a bunch of random thoughts that might occur to anyone of his background and training in analytic philosophy. But -- and it's a big 'but' -- the sad and grossly unfair fact of the matter is that when a powerful mind simply dashes off something random it can be a lot more exciting than when lesser minds grind out thoroughly researched and polished pieces of work. That is, after all, something that Shakespeare himself seems to teach us, for instance in the great tavern scene of 2 Henry IV, act II scene 4, which, as J. B. Priestley remarked, 'is a creation of sheer genius, and lifts Shakespeare as high above his fellows as does any of his great tragic scenes, for they tried in play after play to make such scenes come to life, and yet did nothing like this, seemingly thrown out carelessly'.[1] McGinn's reflections on the character of Cordelia -- written as it obviously is in ignorance of what an enormous tradition of criticism, from Gervinus to Germaine Greer, has had to say on the subject -- is, in my view (and I have read a fair bit of that tradition), one of the best things anyone has ever said about her character, for all that it was written -- at least it gives that impression -- off the cuff. Cutrofello, in spite of all his reading, has nothing comparable to offer.

But I do recommend this book to anyone who cares about both philosophy and literature. If that description applies to you, you will certainly find this book at the very least suggestive, and perhaps more than merely suggestive. And, as I have said, suggestiveness is in itself a desirable quality in a book. I do not myself see that it goes further than suggestiveness, but I encourage you to read the book and see what you think; you may disagree. And you will certainly enjoy exploring with the author the many interconnections that his wide researches enable him to make. I didn't notice many tricks that Cutrofello missed, but here's one, on which I shall finish. He has a nice quote from Lessing's Briefe, die neueste Literatur betreffend (p. 44):

"Nobody," say the authors of the Bibliothek [der schönen Wissenschaften], "will deny that the German stage owes a large part of its initial improvement to Professor Gottsched".

I am this Nobody; I deny it straightaway.[2]

To which one might juxtapose:

'I see nobody on the road,' said Alice.

'I only wish I had such eyes,' the King remarked in a fretful tone. 'To be able to see Nobody! And at that distance too! Why, it's as much as I can do to see real people, by this light!'.[3]

It makes for a good joke, confusing proper names and quantifiers in that way, and it is intriguing to note how Lessing anticipates the better-known passage from Carroll. Cutrofello's book is full of such observations, even if he missed this one. Intriguing, yes; but where is the thought going? What is to be built on these foundations? That is my problem.

[1] Cited in A. R. Humphreys, King Henry IV Part 2 (London: Cengage, 2007), p. 62.

[2] Lessing, Werke, vol. 5 (Darmstadt: WBG, 1996), p. 70.

[3] Lewis Carroll, Through the Looking Glass and What Alice Found There (London: Oxford University Press, 1971), p. 198.