All in the Family: On Community and Incommensurability

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Kennan Ferguson, All in the Family: On Community and Incommensurability, Duke University Press, 2012, 216pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822351900.

Reviewed by Karin Brown, San Jose State University


Kennan Ferguson offers a critique of the prevalent conception of community in social and political theory, and he proposes an alternative view of what constitutes a community. In political theory (particularly liberal theories but others as well) normative unity seems essential to a community, and conversely, incommensurability or difference is viewed as unfortunate, as something that subverts collective political action and should be overcome. (Ferguson seems not to envision incommensurability in mathematical or Kuhnianterms as irreconcilable or incompatible viewpoints, but rather as simply difference or conflict.) Ferguson identifies the family as a model for the conception of community in political theory in the history of Western thought. However, he claims, the view of the family commonly depicted in political philosophy is idealized and unrealistic, and consequently, the conception of the community that follows is impoverished.

In political theory the family has been conceived as a patriarchal, stable, harmonious unit with shared values; the community is likewise described as having these traits. In reality, the family is better described by incommensurability or as internally conflicted, and the family serves as an example that incommensurability or, perhaps better, diversity and unity are compatible. Similarly, a better description of community is one in which such diversity or incommensurability and community can coexist. Moreover, Ferguson argues that incommensurability is essential to the family as it serves as a condition of engagement through negotiations. Ferguson claims that the family has been neglected in political theory, an unfortunate circumstance given the significant influence it has on people's lives. He undertakes a study of the family and asks what can we learn from families. His aim is to reconceptualize the family by learning from quotidian practices of people's lives. Then from families we can learn about communities, where dealing with incommensurability is the most important lesson.

Ferguson begins by describing the family and the way in which it was depicted and used in political theory. The family is broadly conceived here. In order to allow flexibility, Ferguson does not offer a specific definition of family. He holds that any number of constellations of people living together can constitute a family, for instance, kids living with relatives other than parents or same sex couples. Real families are characterized by incommensurability. He even claims that people do not fully understand each other as well as they imagine; people can be unpredictable and can always surprise you. People also can disappoint, miscommunicate, and hurt each other, yet they form families. Families operate despite incommensurability. Incommensurability does not usually result in the breakdown of the family.

The family plays an important role in politics. Historically the patriarchal family was used as a model for political organization, particularly as a justification of power and natural authority. The power differentials that exist in the family were viewed as natural, and thus political power became naturalized. Ferguson shows that the nominal power structure within families appears in the modern liberal tradition as well in Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and even Mill. In contemporary political theory, the depiction of the traditional family is replaced by the nuclear family, but it maintains the same power structure. Ferguson makes an important contribution here because usually the criticism of the liberal tradition on the part of feminists and communitarians is that it is individualistic. He shows that it is not simple individualism that serves as a better paradigm for social and political relations but that the family still underpins political relations. The nuclear family functions in political theory as an individual unit where one's loyalties are to one's intimates.

The discrepancy between actual families and the perfect, fictional depiction in political theory leads to two implausibilities, One is a moral and political philosophy consisting of clean, universal and abstract rules. The other is that community and incommensurability seem to be incompatible.

Regarding the first point, Ferguson undertakes a criticism of rationalism in ethical and political theory. He notes that moral theories formulate universal moral judgments as absolute rules to follow. Despite rules and ideals, in real situations people might act differently and betray ideals. In addition, ethical theories overlook the role of emotions in people's behavior. A closer look at the family reveals that family members face conflicts in particular situations, not universal ones. People are also more concerned about immediate and concrete problems rather than universal abstract ideals, about loved ones more than global justice. People make moral choices in particular situations and in the context of particular experiences. Ferguson explores several examples, one of which concerns someone's position regarding same sex marriage. Conceivably, a religious family confronted with a gay daughter might overcome their religious objection for their daughter's sake. Conversely, a progressive family confronted with the same issue might find themselves unable to accept gay marriage when their ideals are put to the test of personal experience.

Regarding the second point (concerning community and incommensurability), in actual families differences and identification are compatible. People disagree about same sex marriage, for instance, but they share a legal system, a language, a sense of morality, and a commitment to family. There are no families without conflict and, likewise, no communities without political disagreements. In the family, contention and commonality actively happen. The family is also where we learn to be attentive, love and care. Both conflicts and care coexist within the family. We can learn from families because families embody the dynamics of incommensurability and community.

The idea of morality as contextual and stemming from experience is not new. Simone de Beauvoir in The Ethics of Ambiguity argued that ethics is not universal and abstract, but rather contextual and experienced in real life. Subsequently, the idea that abstract rational rules in moral theory are not enough was developed in feminist ethics. Virginia Held, for instance, deals with this issue extensively. She explains that the predominance of rationality in moral theory is geared at excluding emotions and aims at impartiality for the purpose of justice, fairness and consistency. This omission is unfortunate, since other than losing significant aspects of morality (such as care) the theories rendered are often neither useful nor applicable to real life situations. Held explains that in order for moral theory to be applicable to real situations it ought to be both derived and tested in experience. She coined the term "moral experience," to denote judgments that are arrived at in actual, rather than hypothetical situations. Take, for instance, the issue of treatment of animals. Held points out that you might believe that eating meat is healthy, but upon coming face to face with factory farming, you might decide to refrain from consuming meat. Rather than our figuring out an abstract, impartial point of view, morality would be better served by our considering actual persons in concrete situations.[1] One of the common denominators in the ethics of care is criticism of the idea that people simply follow (and ought to follow) general abstract rules of morality. Ferguson's arguments in this chapter fit well with this tradition.

The idea that the family can serve as a model for community is also dealt with in feminist ethics. However, the literature in feminist ethics focuses on dependency and care in the family as a better paradigm for social and political relations. Ferguson's contribution is his focus on incommensurability in the family as a model for public community.

Ferguson continues to attack the idea that communities require commonality. He notes that both liberals and communitarians are guilty of the assumption that people must share a normative ideology. Even though liberals and communitarians advocate different sets of values, in both schools of thought community exemplifies unity. Disagreements seem a threat to politics. What is wrong, then, with this notion of unity among peers in a community? Ferguson argues that unity entails a radical exclusion of political conflict. He reminds us that grappling with class struggle in Marx and recognizing the oppression of women resulted in new forms of freedom and liberty. Differences and an active engagement with them lead to a better theory or ideology and a better community. As a new vision of community, instead of an exclusionary system of sameness, Ferguson proposes a multiple, contentious one, much like the family.

After his analysis of the family and community, Ferguson proceeds to build his case for both the incommensurability in the family and community and attendant benefits. Consistent with his criticism of moral theories, Ferguson turns to real, lived experiences, and he attacks the presumption that community requires commonality by showing that the family does not. As mentioned, the overall question in this work is: what can we learn from families? Ferguson examines four phenomena and the way they operate in families: silence, ownership of dogs, disabilities, and language. He tackles these cases to show the complexities of familial life, human relations, and, of course, incommensurability and it advantages.

Silence is usually viewed as a threat to community or at least as not compatible with community. In communication studies, for instance, silence is viewed as lack of communication, and in feminist theory silence is viewed as powerlessness. In effect, silence can be used to negotiate conflicts. Politically it can be a form of resistance. Silence can evoke or incite a reaction. Conversely, silence can also function as a role in creating community, for example in concerts, in a Quaker meeting, or in Buddhist meditation. In silence incommensurability and community can co-exist.

People love their dogs. Shifting attention to pets provides another example of ethical and political behavior that does not always follow clear, logical and universal principles. People can spend a significant amount of money on their pets and at the same time be aware that there are humans whose lives could be saved by using this money for a humanitarian cause. If universalized ethical commitments were determinants of behavior, people would be wrong to prioritize pets over humans (in case their ideal entails a commitment to humans above animals). There is no shortage of examples with pets in which love trumps logic. Ferguson thinks that moral theorists can learn from relationships with non-humans about the particularity of ethical commitments as opposed to the generality of normative rules from relation with non-humans. Ferguson notes that most theorists (with few exceptions) fail to address the relation to non-humans. The relation of dogs and people is complicated from a social-political point of view. Dogs are not equal to humans. The connection is emotional. There is certainly an imbalance in power. Yet, that imbalance does not adversely affect their connection, but shows that there is a connection despite profound differences. Incommensurability here is not pernicious. Quite the contrary, bonding, love and devotion exist despite it.

Disability is another area in which morality arises in context, in this case care. People with disabilities experience life differently. Their caregivers must imagine themselves in their place and in their body without undergoing the same challenges. As a result, caregivers' experience of the world is transformed as well. Ferguson focuses on the way in which disability and caring for the disabled transforms one's perception of space. Disabled people experience space differently than abled-bodied people do.[2] The disabled view distances, steps, and bathrooms in a different way. The presence or lack of wheelchair access becomes prominent. Although Ferguson focuses on space primarily as an aesthetic issue, he does note that there are political implications to the way we view space. For instance, space can be used to privilege, exclude or force people into specific places.

In addition, there are often conflicts and difficult decisions to make that are bridged through the experience of caring. Care transforms one's understanding of community. With regard to disability and care it is worth mentioning Eva Kittay's work, Love's Labor: Essays on Women, Equality, and Dependency[3], in which she provides a compelling philosophical account, written from a moving personal perspective, of the way in which caring for a disabled child and dependency work in general to shape us and our understanding of social and political theory.

Lastly, Ferguson turns to linguistic incommensurability and its advantages. Terms such as liberty, freedom and democracy can possess different meanings in various contexts or theories. Out of linguistic incommensurability engagement over terminology emerges. Meaning is not and should not be fixed, as it is not in the very conceptual foundation of this book -- the family. However, language and incommensurability do clash with the demands of public policy. Poverty, for instance, does need to be defined. So incommensurability of terminology must be overcome, but this end is better achieved by constant engagement rather than through finding a fixed universal meaning. With the example of language, Ferguson's point becomes stronger in claiming that community of meaning exists because of linguistic incommensurability. Likewise, in the family out of overcoming conflicts a better familial life emerges.

These four examples serve to show two things: one, that incommensurability does not threaten notions of the family, and two, that incommensurability has positive results. Ferguson concludes that the family shows that differences do not exclude commonality. The complexity of family relations should not be forgotten particularly if the family is to underpin the concept of political communities. Just as family members should be committed to work and even change to overcome their differences, a community should be conceived as comprised of committed citizens much like the family and its members. In both family and community, community emerges out of engaging withincommensurabilities.

As noted above, Ferguson's contribution is to look at conflicts within the family rather than merely affective ties to learn about communities and politics. Ferguson's argument is rich in research as he draws on a variety of disciplines -- feminist philosophy, social philosophy, linguistics, ethics, and political theory. He makes his case with use of ample examples. Ferguson sets out to provide a new conceptual framework for community, and he does do that very well. Ferguson's contribution lies in his conceptual analysis of what a community is, and in this regard his book serves as a contribution to social and political philosophy. In addition, this book contributes to criticism of simple rationalism in moral and political theory. Ferguson shows that even though previous criticisms are found in communitarianism, feminism and existentialism, these schools of thought did not say enough about the family.

While Ferguson's ideas about community are interesting and intriguing, the reader is left to wonder about implications. What is to be gained from this perspective as opposed to the one he criticizes (the unified community)? He says very little about his new vision of a community. Ferguson does mention that a community patterned after the real, rather than fictional family will harbor inclusionary, rather than exclusionary attitudes towards dissenters. Conflicts and disagreements will not be seen as a threat to the community, but rather an opportunity to create community. Presumably such a community will be a tolerant one. It would have been interesting to learn more about the political implications of incommensurability and community.

[1] See: Virginia Held, Right and Goods: Justifying Social Action (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1989; The Free Press, 1984) and Feminist Morality: Transforming Culture, Society, and Politics (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1993).

[2] Ferguson uses the terms "disabled" and "able-bodied" with quotation marks to note the complexity and culturally dependent nature of these terms.

[3] Eva Feder Kittay, Love's Labor: Essays on Woman, Equality, and Dependency (New York and London: Routledge, 1999).