All Things Shining: Reading the Western Classics to Find Meaning in a Secular Age

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Hubert Dreyfus and Sean Dorrance Kelly, All Things Shining: Reading the Western Classics to Find Meaning in a Secular Age, Free Press, 2011, 254pp., $15.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781416596165.

Reviewed by Kyla Ebels-Duggan, Northwestern University


Those not initiated into the practice of academic philosophy tend to assume that daunting questions about the meaning of life are its main occupation. But any academic philosopher knows how far this is from the truth. Speaking to questions simultaneously so momentous and so ill-defined hazards both offensive pretension and embarrassing silliness. So it is easy to see why, over the last century, an increasingly professionalized discipline agreed to treat them as inappropriate for grown-up philosophers, notwithstanding the interest they held for grown-ups such as Plato and Kant. But in a salutary trend, some mature minds have recently returned to this topic. Hubert Dreyfus and Sean Kelly are to be commended for their presence among them.

Having determined to face the risks, Dreyfus and Kelly take no half measures. They open All Things Shining with a promise of no less than deliverance from the boredom, nihilism and despair that they think characteristic of our "secular age:"

anyone who is done with indecision and waiting, with expressionlessness and lostness and sadness and angst, and who is ready for whatever it is that comes next; anyone with hope instead of despair, or anyone with despair that they would like to leave behind, can find something worthwhile in the pages ahead. (xi)

To accomplish this deliverance they take readers on a whirlwind tour through the history of Western thought. The tour, though necessarily selective, serves two purposes. First, it provides an account of the causes and character of the contemporary malaise. In short, the problem is the need for a middle path between two tempting, though in the authors' view bankrupt, positions. The first is the "temptation to monotheism," which they trace to the rise of Christianity. But this is not a book for monotheists and does not purport to address them. Rather, its audience is those living in the wake of monotheism, people who cannot regard believing in God as a serious option but still have sensibilities shaped by a recently monotheistic culture. Monotheism promised "ultimate or final" meaning (179), "an ultimate truth behind everything that is" (181). The authors never make entirely clear what they mean by a "final" or "ultimate" account. But, as their extended discussion of Melville's Moby Dick makes clear, they think that the possibility of such a thing disappears with monotheistic faith. Still saddled with unsatisfiable longing for ultimate meaning, post-monotheist secularists fall prey to the second temptation, trying to create this meaning for themselves. This turns out to be merely a detour to the same ennui and despair it aimed to avoid.

Though they claim to provide glimpses of a "hidden history of the West" (89), some elements of the authors' historical story are familiar: Judeo-Christian monotheism crowds out earlier possibilities, Luther -- quite unintentionally -- plants the seeds of autonomous meaning-creation with his individualist opposition to the Catholic church, Descartes expands individualism into epistemology, Kant carries this further than anyone had intended with his Copernican revolution, and this leads on to Nietzsche's subjectivism. David Foster Wallace is cast as spokesperson for the contemporary inheritors of the nihilism that the authors think results. On their view, Wallace displays particular insight into the problem of contemporary life: our loss of the sense that anything could be more worth doing than anything else. Their Wallace tries to apply a Nietzschean solution, inserting significance into the world through individual acts of will. But the attempt fails and despair ensues.

There are certainly inaccuracies of interpretation in this historical story, and sensitive readers of any of the figures whom they treat may be tempted to dismiss the project on these grounds. But such problems inevitably plague sweeping historical narratives, especially those that strive for accessibility beyond the cadre of academics. Better to ask whether Dreyfus and Kelly give us a helpful description of the -- or at least a -- state of mind characteristic of our age. I incline toward an affirmative answer. Once articulated, the problem they articulate appears familiar. Many experience ours as an age of myriad options and no real basis for choosing among them.

Perhaps it is not maximally charitable, but neither is it egregiously inaccurate, to characterize Dreyfus and Kelly's antidote as consisting in some mix of baseball games and coffee. The second function of the historical story is to aim to earn this response a serious hearing by providing it with impressive historical credentials. If the problem is a lack of basis for choice, the authors' solution lies largely in giving up on our idea of ourselves as choosers. For an alternative they take us back to Homeric Greece, suggesting that these polytheists long ago laid the safe path between the unsatisfiable longing for an external source of ultimate meaning and the inevitable disappointment of subjectivism. They commend the pagan Queequeg of Moby Dick as a more recent articulator of this ancient wisdom.

The authors' Homeric Greek path consists of three elements. It begins with polytheism. The multiple Greek deities personify multiple, sometimes incompatible, ideals, any of which could lend significance to ancient lives. So, in extolling Greek polytheism Dreyfus and Kelly are, in the first place, affirming a widely accepted thesis of value pluralism, one that is compatible with both atheism and monotheism. But the talk of polytheism also aims to capture a further point about the passivity of individual agents. Their Greek, unlike their Kantian or Nietzschean, supposedly did not conceive of himself as actively deciding where to locate meaning. Rather, he found himself swept up in something of significance independent of himself and his will, as if under the power of a god.

In the last chapter, the authors expand this point about passivity with the second of their central Greek concepts, physis. They use the term physis to name the experience of an ecstatic welling up of an unquestionable sense of significance. This is where baseball comes in. While those in monotheistic cultures tend to experience physis in acts of communal worship, the authors think that what they experience remains available in our secular era. Sporting events are their leading example of a contemporary context for physis. When the crowd responds to the game-winning home run, they write, "there is no question of ironic distance from the event. That is the moment when the sacred shines." (194)

Physis supposedly avoids the difficulties of other strands of the Western tradition. It answers to the loss of an external source of ultimate meaning without succumbing to the illusion that we could create these meanings ourselves. Physis is passive and standardly communal. We do not willfully generate it. Rather -- in the authors' perhaps too memorable phrase -- it whooshes over us, leaving no room for reflection, cynicism, or doubt. Thus it contrasts with attempts to create meaning through autonomous acts of individual will. Moreover, physis does not purport to ultimate significance. It is local and temporary. No one thinks that life is all about the home run that just brought the crowd to its feet. Nevertheless, the overwhelming sense of significance it creates staves off nihilism.

But the overwhelming, passive, communal nature of physis brings problems of its own. What whooshes over the crowd may be as benign as a home run or as salutary as a Martin Luther King speech. But it may just as easily be something as pernicious as a Nazi rally. The authors' initial emphasis on the experience of physis, and neutrality towards the content that inspires it, deepens this worry, but they eventually acknowledge and address the threat. They counter it in a roundabout way, by appeal to the third of their Greek concepts, poiesis, or craftsmanship.

Poiesis involves both passive and active elements. It is passive in its receptiveness to what is given in the world. Poiesis orients the craftsman. To practice his craft the wheelwright must perceive distinctions among types and pieces of wood invisible to others. But poiesis also involves an active element of judgment. The craftsman's attunement to the significance of the knot allows him to judge well how to use the wood in which he finds it. This active element provides the basis of the authors' hope that poiesis can rescue physis. To meet the threat that we will be co-opted into malicious ends, we need sensitivity to the difference between moments in which it is appropriate to be swept up in the energy of a crowd and those in which it is not. Dreyfus and Kelly encourage us to assimilate this skill of discernment to the wheelwright's ability to discern which wood is appropriate for his wheel, calling it metapoiesis.

The passive, orienting function of poiesis allows it to serve also as a second, independent source of significance. The authors contrast craftsmanship with the application of technology. While the former is receptive, the latter allows us to shape our environment according to our own desires. And while the former requires the application of skilled judgment, a new technology commends itself by advertising that "even a child could do it." The wheelwright discerns distinctions in the wood that have no significance for the operator of the band-saw. Thus technology can render previously significant aspects of the world inconsequential and cause skills to atrophy. Its advancement threatens to shrink the scope of meaning in our lives even as it eases our difficulties.

One might worry that this argument founders on an equivocation on "significance." Dreyfus and Kelly move from what we might call significance as relevance to the suggestion that the wheelwright has access to a distinctive source of significance as meaning, the notion invoked in the book's subtitle. But there are resources for bridging this apparent gap. Heidegger is the rarely-mentioned hero here and in other parts of the book, but the view is also reminiscent of Rawls' Aristotelian Principle. Rawls claims that the good -- the significant -- life for human beings involves the development and exercise of complex skills. Putting the authors' worry about technology in these terms might remove the appearance of equivocation. The more technology advances, the fewer opportunities we have for the exercise of complex skills, and thus the more impoverished our lives threaten to become.

Even if technology can squeeze out areas of significance, the authors offer hope that it cannot eliminate opportunities for poiesis altogether. They recommend that we each identify activities that matter to us and then heighten our involvement in them. The leading example here is preparing and consuming one's morning coffee. Though some may value this merely instrumentally, others regard it as inherently worthwhile. If you are in the latter category, the next step is to "invest" in this experience by buying a special mug that highlights the coffee's color or a special blanket that accentuates the coziness of drinking it. This sort of involvement can bring coffee consumption to the level of a craft, as one develops "the skill for knowing how to pick exactly the right coffee, exactly the right cup, exactly the right place to drink it, and to cultivate exactly the right companions to drink it with" (218). In such ways a mundane activity can become a ritual that preserves a sense of significance or even of the sacred.

Despite the subtleties of their view, it's not clear that Dreyfus and Kelly manage to steer their combination of physis and poiesis -- baseball and coffee -- between the dichotomies that they articulate. The authors dismiss the possibility of an objective source of meaning -- at least of "ultimate" meaning -- and critique attempts to meet our yearning for one by subjective creation. But, unsurprisingly, they have difficulty locating a third possibility. The "whoosh" of physis initially seems to be purely subjective, an experiential value that floats free of its sources. When worries about pernicious sources throw this subjectivism into question, metapoiesis is supposed to provide an answer. What we are not told is how metapoiesis can work other than by tracking objective values, or how these differ from the final or ultimate values that the authors think we must discard with monotheism. Moreover, though metapoiesis is supposed to address the problem raised by the passivity of physis, this skill of discernment is itself a passive aspect of our experience of the world. The fancy Greek name does not provide any direction about how to cultivate it.

Or consider whether your coffee matters to you. The authors' recommendation here is supposed to differ from the autonomy strategy in that you are to discover rather than decide what you value. (The authors suggest that the latter approach won't work any better with coffee than it does with romance.) But there is a real threat that you will discover that you find nothing really worthwhile -- no option more worth choosing than any other. The example, which might have been harvested straight from the Crate and Barrel catalog, doesn't help here. Some may be satisfied with this consumerist version of the good life, while others may find it laughable. But what of those who find the suggestion that significance lies in such things utterly depressing, even crushing? The authors have little to say to such a person. But this is what despair is like.

The authors' most significant mistake then is their early promise that they can address this state of mind. Baseball games are great fun and coffee is nice, but offered as antidotes to despair these things are hard to take seriously. Instead the book accomplishes the more modest goal of demonstrating that a breakdown of experienced meaning in the wake of secularism is not wholly inevitable. The result is that the authors' engaging reading of selections from the Western canon leaves everyone right where they were. It neither addresses the monotheist nor delivers the despairing secularist. But those fortunate enough to have the resources to invest in baseball games and coffee rituals, and the disposition not to worry too much about the "ultimate" significance of such things, will find affirmation here.