All Thoughts Are Equal: Laruelle and Nonhuman Philosophy

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John Ó Maoilearca, All Thoughts Are Equal: Laruelle and Nonhuman Philosophy, University of Minnesota Press, 2015, 375pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816697359.

Reviewed by Anthony Paul Smith, La Salle University


Hyperbole might lead one to claim that today, more than ever, the question of equality is of the upmost ethical importance and that philosophers must attend to that question if they wish to remain relevant. The truth is that the demand and cry for equality has long been sounded and long gone unanswered by the powers of this world. Furthermore philosophers have largely constructed a philosophy of inequality through their practice of distinction or decision (from the Latin decidere, literally meaning to "to cut off"). What would it mean to take the demand and anguished cry for equality seriously, not only as a political and ethical demand, but as a demand for the performance of thinking itself? In this book, John Ó Maoilearca cautions that we should not be naive about this demand simply being a matter of practical questions since practice is not a simple thing unmoored from thinking itself, and in fact practices and performances and even postures are forms of thought. He responds to the demand for equality within the practice of thinking with an audacious book that brings together traditional philosophical work excavating the history of philosophy with more contested fields like film-philosophy, animal-philosophy. The result is both a remarkable and critical overview of François Laruelle's non-philosophy and an extension of this methodology beyond mere introduction or uncritical emulation to something like a critical "ventriloquizing".

A lesser thinker would find it hard to make such disparate fields hang together, but Ó Maoilearca deftly brings them into a unified practice through the methodology of Laruelle and a sharp framing technique, mimicking the practice of obstruction as practiced in The Five Obstructions (2003), a film by Lars von Trier and Jørgen Leth. In this film von Trier challenges his mentor Leth to remake his short The Perfect Human (1967) (von Trier's favorite film) with five obstructions. Such obstructions or "creative restraints" force Leth to break from his established creative habits in an attempt to reach the artistic act free from choices made in advance.[1] Ó Maoilearca adopts this form to present non-philosophy constrained by five obstructions. Specifically he forces non-philosophy to perform within the confines of philosophy (chapter 1), para-consistent logic (chapter 2), behaviorism (chapter 3), animality (chapter 4), and performance (chapter 5). These chapters form the bulk of the book, but they are framed by an extensive introduction and a conclusion with coda that are both powerful in how they situate the five main chapters and extend the conclusions found in those chapters. The seemingly disparate subject matter hinted at in this list belies the book's fundamental coherence, achieved not just through the framing of the introduction and conclusion but the way each chapter folds into the others. For each chapter weaves together Ó Maoilearca's concerns with equality as such. Chapters 1, 2, 3, and 5 are concerned directly with the question of the status of extra-philosophical materials (like film, painting, psychology, and so on) to philosophy and its judgment. Woven throughout the book is the figure of the equality of the animal, though this is given special attention in chapter 4.

This original form for the book results in a very different kind of introduction to the work of Laruelle than the neophyte to non-philosophy might be expecting or even hoping for. This is not an introduction in the traditional sense, but largely an introduction to what work the framework and methodology of non-philosophy allows for. Ó Maoilearca does devote the first ninety-five pages (roughly one-third of the total) to presenting Laruelle's non-philosophy in a more standard introductory idiom. There we find non-philosophy contextualized within a wide-ranging discussion of the overarching identity and practice of philosophy, with some special attention devoted to some of Laruelle's French contemporaries. The constraint that Ó Maoilearca tackles in these pages is daunting. It is not an easy task to synthesize Laruelle's sprawling twenty-plus book oeuvre into its central concepts and present them in a way that does not undo their integrity while at the same time revealing their importance for known philosophical problems. Yet, the reader uncertain about the meaning of terms like "the Real" or Laruelle's particular syntax is certain to find a useful resource here. While a small number of secondary works on Laruelle have appeared in the past five years, Ó Maoilearca ranks amongst the most clear and the most attuned to problems in both Anglophone and Continental philosophy. While this is unlikely to silence critics who hold that Laruelle's global critique of philosophy flattens out the varied forms of philosophy found throughout the world, it does at least speak to the most dominant disciplinary forms of philosophy named as such by contemporary universities in Europe and America.

Throughout the book the constraints presented for Ó Maoilearca prove to be generative for both presenting central concepts and arguments in Laruelle's non-philosophy as well as for confronting real problems present in those domains (philosophy included). For example, the question regarding the identity of the human is a central problem in Laruelle's work; indeed he names it as the central problem, claiming that non-philosophy "is centred on the term of 'man', on man and on the knowledge that we can have of humans."[2] Laruelle very purposefully chooses the term "identity" rather than essence, existence, or being when he discusses the human. His own probings into this problem have tended to focus on human creations like philosophy itself, art, or religious thought and have tended to shy away from long discussions of nonhuman entities like animals.[3]

Ó Maoilearca pushes Laruelle here by constraining non-philosophy with the question of the animal. By way of an excursion through recent philosophical speculation on the animal, both in the Anglophone world and in French, German, and Italian philosophy, Ó Maoilearca shows that what Laruelle claims of the human in relation to philosophy is true of the animal as well. Laruelle claims that philosophy always harasses human beings, while his maxim that "philosophy is made for [the human], not [the human] for philosophy" is presented as a reversal of the usual "philosomorphism" of standard philosophical practice. Philosophy always makes use of the human in order to present philosophy itself. So the "real of the human" (a jarring term necessary because Laruelle marks a distinction between réalité and the réel) is always "effaced by Being and its avatars" (196). In other words, rather than think the identity of the human directly, philosophy is only ever able to present the human in relation to something other than the human. Ó Maoilearca amplifies Laruelle's own examples of the usual philosophical tropes of man as a rational animal, as a wolf to man, as Dasein, as overman, as becoming-animal, as subject, and so on. He shows how this same philosomorphism works when thinking about animals as well, noting that the animal serves as an index of death in Derrida's work, as an index of life in Deleuze's work, and as the index of industralized transformation of human life into death in Agamben's work. Against such overdetermination Ó Maoilearca turns to the destruction of the border between human and animal found in cinematic horror to locate the "political threat, or promise, of the animal not being an 'animal' either" (208).

When the identity of both the human and the animal is freed from philosophical decisions, free from their effacements by philosophy, we can begin to work with a radicalized minimal anthropomorphism. This argument will perhaps be surprising to many in the field of animal studies, but Ó Maoilearca's claims and building out from Laruelle share much in common with ethnographic practices and with the philosophical engagement of ethology found in Vinciane Despret's work and the anthropological work of Eduardo Viveiros de Castro's distinct form of perspectivalism developed in dialogue with indigenous cosmologies. As he states,

It is not that we can avoid philosomorphism altogether: as a subspecies of anthropomorphism, it will always be the case that some kind of leap of faith, act of charity, 'theory of mind,' or hermeneutical 'stance' is needed to understand one's other, whatever or whoever 'it' may be (208).

The problem with this anthropomorphism is that it is not radical in its partiality, for the direction of action goes one way: "We do it to them" (208). Ó Maoilearca instead posits a radical anthropomorphism where the animal may "reshape what the human can be" (209). Following arguments made by others, including Viveiros de Castro in anthropology and myself with regard to ecology, Ó Maoilearca shows that this vision of anthropomorphism provides descriptions of real processes of exchange and mutation. This opens up to a deep exploration of the animal-human mixture in horror movies and an enthralling discussion of the human as an idiot that draws upon and brings together an investigation of shooting techniques in film and a reading of the Glaucon episode in Plato's Republic (an episode that becomes the set-up for a particularly memorable Father Ted joke about Father Dougal's idiocy). Such "idiocy" is the truth of the equalizing consequence of immanence where there is no distance, no distinction. Such a cinematic democracy, as present in Bazin and Fellini, "makes us animal" (227) and yet "the animal is not an animal either" (208).

This seeming contradiction is prepared for by the earlier chapter on paraconsistent logic. In it Ó Maoilearca forces non-philosophy to present itself in relation to paraconsistent logic as developed out of Meinong's theory of objects and in the work of Graham Priest. This provides a way to understand contradictions like the one above that might save readers of Laruelle from both overly simplistic understandings of his work along the lines of some pop caricature of postmodernism (or even existentialism) as well as hasty dismissals of Laruelle's work based on a poor understanding of the arguments. What Laruelle's position shares with Meinong's theory of objects is an identification of objects that do not exist as real. Thus the unicorn may not exist in the strong sense that a horse does, but it is real as an intended object. Even the seemingly commonsense distinction between a unicorn and a horse is real in a different way from an actual and known living horse. For Laruelle the relative realness of these objects is given by the radical immanence of the Real. As Ó Maoilearca writes, "It is the radical immanence of the Real that renders everything 'real.' We begin with the Real rather than either a mind or a logic still accountable to classical philosophy . . . Each thing (object, being, life, process) 'denotes' itself alone" (123). Everything within thought is equal precisely because it is relative to the Real, because within itself and without relation (one way to understand radical immanence) it is real.

When Laruelle has made such claims, other philosophers have taken offense at the affront to the dignity of philosophy. This offense may arise in response to the consequences of Laruelle's realist stance where philosophy's attempts at distinctions and the decisions it makes over "this" or "that" are illusory and fictional. Yet this understanding of philosophy as simply fiction is what frees philosophy from its self-sufficiency and pretentiousness, for both Laruelle and Ó Maoilearca. By virtue of the theory of the Real, this doesn't commit Laruelle to a toothless intellectual enterprise that might be threatened by the sciences where truth is simply given. Laruelle's entire conception of philosophy as fiction is derived from a deep engagement with the practice of the sciences, as Ó Maoilearca details throughout the book. The sciences are all partial in their practice and the truths that they discover are all fictional in the same consistent sense that philosophy can be. Consider again the example of ethology where certain forms of anthropomorphism are useful for the scientific work. While the material and occasion for this scientific work differs from art, both art and science use these radical fictions to reveal deep realities of what it means to be human or otherwise.

As Ó Maoilearca is concerned throughout his book with equality and cleaving to consequences that comes from the demand that "all thoughts are equal," readers might reproach him with the question of evaluation. Within such radical equality how are we to decide between good and bad fictions? Such a question lies within the central decisional practices of philosophy itself and as such Ó Maoilearca resists it. It is a question of who might be still be excluded -- indeed, who might be excluded by necessity for the sake of order -- within the liberal philosopher's dream of an expanding circle of moral progress that "gradually conquers tribalism, nationalism, racism, sexism, ageism, etc" (210). It is testament to Ó Maoilearca's intellectual courage that he refuses to engage with this question on the assumed grounds. If radical equality is real rather than merely a goal hoped for and thereby provides some regulation for thought, then this can only be treated as a false question. Instead, Ó Maoilearca asks the question of "the worst possible" instead of the greatest good or best possible.

Undoubtedly some readers will be troubled by these conclusions and not all will share my enthusiasm for this book. Yet, the clarity of Ó Maoilearca's prose and presentation combined with the power and cogency of his arguments means that few will walk away empty handed. Those working in post-Kantian Continental philosophy, film-philosophy (and film studies generally), animal-philosophy (and animal studies generally) are likely to find a new concept or new insight that may extend their own thinking. In working with Ó Maoilearca's book as material with which to build further they may find that they were already non-philosophers without knowing it.

[1] See pp. 34-42 for a longer discussion of the film and Ó Maoilearca's use of the film as a form.

[2] Robin Mackay and François Laruelle, "Laruelle Undivided" in From Decision to Heresy: Experiments in Non-Standard Thought (Urbanomic, 2012), 10.

[3] For Laruelle's limited comments on animals see his recent François Laruelle, General Theory of Victims, trans. Jessie Hock and Alex Dubilet (Polity, 2015), 102-105. In an earlier work originally published in French in 1992, Laruelle engages at more length with the problem of artificial intelligence, another nonhuman entity, but one that bears on its creator (the human). See François Laruelle, Theory of Identities, trans. Alyosha Edlebi (Columbia University Press, 2016), 189-256. Readers should note that, owing to an overzealous house style at Columbia, many of Laruelle's graphemes are excised from this otherwise good translation. While these aspects of Laruelle's writing are sometimes off-putting to Anglophone readers (most notably the distinction cast between "nonphilosophy" and "non-philosophy"), they do mark important distinctions within his writing and so it is unfortunate to see them not retained in English translation.