Allocating Scarce Medical Resources: Roman Catholic Perspectives

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Engelhardt, Jr., H. Tristram and Mark J. Cherry, (eds.), Allocating Scarce Medical Resources: Roman Catholic Perspectives , Georgetown University Press, 2002, 331pp, $39.95 (pbk) ISBN 0878408827.

Reviewed by Christopher Kaczor, Loyola Marymount University


Arising from four conferences held in Europe and the United States, this volume contains eighteen essays written mostly by Roman Catholics with the exception of select contributions from Jewish, Protestant, and Orthodox perspectives. Most essays pay particular attention to the distribution of scarce medical resources in terms of intensive care units (ICUs) which use some 38% of all medical expenditures in the U.S. each year, one percent of the GNP. The essays often make reference to one another and a wide variety of Catholic perspectives are represented including an essay by Paul Schotsmans of the personalist Louvain school inspired by the work of Louis Janssens, an essay by Joseph Boyle an advocate of the new natural law theory inspired by Germain Grisez, and another essay by Josef Seifert reflecting a Christian phenomenology inspired by Dietrich von Hildebrand. Mary Anne Gardell Cutter, Teodoro Forcht Dagi, Corinna Delkeskamp Hayes, James Heisig, Edward Hughes, George Khushf, Michael Rie, Dietrich Roessler, Paulina Taboada, Kevin Wildes and others I’ll mention more explicitly below also make contributions to the volume. The essays offer a good reflection of the contemporary state of Catholic moral thought with its strengths and diversity and are nicely framed by the ‘outside voices’ of the non-Catholics represented. Philosophers will find some essays almost exclusively theological.

The questions which recur in this volume are put most succinctly perhaps by Ludger Honnefelder in his contribution, “Quality of Life and Human Dignity: Meaning and Limits of Prolongation of Life.” “Is everything that is technically possible also medically mandated?” asks Honnefelder. “Does the patient desire what is technically possible and medically mandated? This leads to a further question: Can what is technically possible, medically mandated, and desired by the patient be made available to everyone within the resources of a public health care system?” (140).

One of the most compelling answers to such questions is offered by M. Cathleen Kaveny in her essay, “Developing the Doctrine of Distributive Justice: Methods of Distribution, Redistribution, and the Role of Time in Allocating Intensive Care Resources.” Although distribution can be considered according to who distributes, what is distributed, or the method of distribution, she considers especially the role played by time in questions of distribution. She argues against the use of time, either directly or indirectly, as a method of distribution in part because time distorts the good at stake, namely health. Just as a physical division of some goods would distort or even destroy the good at stake, for example Solomon’s suggestion that the baby be cut in half and one part given to each of the alleged mothers, so too the use of time as a method of distribution distorts the good of health because health only artificially corresponds to units of time. If two people receive heart transplants, and one is in the hospital for weeks and another for half the time, they did not receive unequal goods or unequal treatment.

Furthermore, Kaveny writes that telling patients or their families “that they have been allocated a certain time span of intensive care may make them focus on the wrong things at the time of illness, thereby interfering with both aspects of the good at stake. So doing may increase their anxiety, impeding their ability to get well and to achieve the first purpose of intensive health care. In addition, by calling to their attention the fact that the bond they have with caregivers is limited by a time span that bears no relationship to their need, they may be unable to receive their health care as a work of mercy. That inability may have serious, nonmedical consequences” (188). Thus, she argues that time should not serve as a direct, and later even as an indirect, method of allocating scarce health care resources in an ICU.

Less compelling resources for answering the questions at hand are provided by Paul T. Schotsmans’ essay, “Equal Care as the Best Care: A Personalist Approach.” “My approach to the problem of health care allocation is inspired by the Louvain personalist model, which may be considered to be identical to the theology of the Pastoral Constitution on the Church in the Modern World of the Second Vatican Council (hereafter Vatican II)” (126). This approach, also called proportionalism and pioneered by Louis Janssens of Louvain, Josef Fuchs of the Gregorianum, and Richard McCormick of the University of Notre Dame among others, can hardly be considered as identical with Pastoral Constitution on the Church in the Modern World (Gaudium et spes) if only because it represents just one school of thought but more importantly because this method of reasoning was first implicitly excluded by Vatican II itself in its condemnation of a variety of ‘kinds’ of acts including abortion and infanticide as well as later excluded by the authentic interpreter of Vatican II, John Paul II in Veritatis splendor. (For more on this topic, from a philosophical perspective, see Christopher Kaczor, Proportionalism and the Natural Law Tradition, The Catholic University of America Press, 2002). Schotsmans also claims, “The person is the moral agent” (126) which, if taken at face value, would exclude those human beings from personhood who do not currently function as moral agents capable of an actus humanus such as fetuses, newborns, small children, the senile, and the seriously ill. This view, irrespective of its truth, cannot be said to be in accord with the Catholic tradition, even broadly considered. The vagueness of proportionalism’s injunction that the means not contradict the end would be of little help in the actual determination of when to end treatment or not even begin it.

Joseph Boyle’s essay takes a step towards answering such questions, first by excluding certain answers to end-of-life questions. For Boyle, as well as the Catholic tradition as a whole, it is always wrong to intentionally take the life of an innocent person. Therefore, any removal of treatment undertaken with the intention to end human life would be wrong. On the other hand, there is never an obligation to use burdensome or extraordinary treatment even to sustain life. How does one decide what is extraordinary? Boyle suggests that we use the idea of vocation as a lodestar in determining such matters. A vocation is an individual call by God to one’s state in life as well as one’s particular responsibilities. I am a husband to this wife, a father of these children, and from this calling other responsibilities follow, for example, to provide a living for them using the talents God has given me. The vocation and responsibilities of a married person with small children at 33 normally differs from a single, childless person at 83. “People who think of their lives vocationally will recognize their abilities as gifts to be used well and the needs of others as opportunities for service. Responsible commitments will be made as one seeks a way of life that will use one’s abilities to serve real human goods. Those commitments generate responsibilities to definite people, and living out those responsibilities structures a moral life. The structure is not rigid because one’s abilities and opportunities develop and change; moreover, one’s responsibilities to others make very variable demands during the course of one’s life” (82).

Boyle does not give us, indeed there cannot be, specific norms to guide health-care decisions in each instance. However, “actions for the sake of life and health will be ‘disproportionate’ or ‘extraordinary’ when they are in some significant way incompatible with carrying out the decision maker’s personal vocation” (82). Since each person has individual responsibility for his or her own vocation, each person therefore also has individual autonomy in deciding what treatments to accept or deny. Freedom is ordered to one’s vocational end, rather than being entirely open-ended as in some understandings of autonomy. Furthermore, for Boyle, “the physician has a duty not to provide futile treatment, because such treatment does not help the patient in ways physicians should, and may cause the patient unjustified harm” (85). Furthermore, such futile treatment is unfair to the community because such valuable resources should not be squandered without benefit. “I suggest, in short, that physicians morally ought to refuse to cooperate with patient requests for treatments that medical consensus judges strictly futile or so unlikely to benefit as to warrant a similar verdict. Adequately informed patients and families will request futile treatments only if they are acting wrongly and asking physicians to do so as well. Acceding to such requests helps no one and turns health care providers into slaves, as it were, to patient and family desires” (86).

As helpful as Boyle’s essay is, at times it makes questionable assumptions. For example, he writes: “Of course, a person can act politically to make a socialized system (such as Canada’s, with which I am familiar) more equitable and far reaching; and a person can make a conscientious choice to buy a smaller health care package for himself and his family so as to have more to share with the needy” (87).

This statement seems to assume a kind of zero sum health care supply, when in fact buying more could possibly stimulate the production of a greater and cheaper supply. When more people began to buy DVD players and cell phones, the prices went down, not up. Nevertheless, Boyle’s essay, and the book as a whole, is well worth reading for those interested in questions of health care allocation of scarce resources.