Allowing for Exceptions: A Theory of Defences and Defeasibility in Law

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Luis Duarte d'Almeida, Allowing for Exceptions: A Theory of Defences and Defeasibility in Law, Oxford University Press, 2015, 293pp., $98.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199685783.

Reviewed by Frederick Schauer, University of Virginia


It is a common feature of rules, in law and elsewhere, that they are subject to exceptions. Killing another person is a crime, unless it is in self-defense, or unless it is done by a police officer in performance of his duties. Contracts signed by both parties are legally enforceable, except when one of the parties has signed under duress, or except when one of the parties is underage. And so on.

In law and legal theory, rules that are subject to exceptions are often referred to, following the terminology adapted from property law by H.L.A. Hart in 1949 and then again in 1961, as defeasible. Rules are defeasible insofar as the principal prescriptions of the rule are subject to defeat if any of some number of defeating conditions are present. That seems straightforward, but what is the relationship between a rule and the exceptions, defenses, or defeating conditions that may negate its mandates? Is there a difference of importance between a rule that says "Keep off the grass, unless authorized," a rule that says "No unauthorized entry onto the grass," and a rule that says "Open to authorized people"?

In this tightly argued and highly valuable book, Luis Duarte d'Almeida tackles the kind of problem presented by the foregoing examples. Under one view, there is nothing especially interesting about the phenomenon of the exception, and the question whether an exception is expressed distinctly or instead is incorporated within a rule's primary prohibition is little more than a linguistic fortuity. To use a quaint example, the difference between "No sexual relations unless with a person to whom you married" and "No fornication" reflects the contingent features of our language, but is otherwise of little or no philosophical, logical, or jurisprudential interest.

An opposing view -- what d'Almeida calls the Irreducibility Thesis (pp. 3-17) -- sees exceptions as presenting an important and independent phenomenon. This appears to have been Hart's view in 1949, (and possibly even in 1961). In talking about legal rules as defeasible Hart thought he was saying something deep and valuable about the operation of rules and the operation of the law.

D'Almeida finds both of these views mistaken, and argues, convincingly, that we cannot understand the defeasibility of rules, or the difference between a rule and an exception, or the relationship between rules and their exceptions generally, unless we attend to issues of burden of proof (pp. 47-134). What distinguishes the rule from the exception is that the hypothetical regulator bears the burden of showing the applicability of the rule, but the hypothetical subject bears the burden of demonstrating that the exception -- the defeating conditions -- absolves him from the requirements of the rule.

D'Almeida is not the first to analyze exceptions and defeasibility through the lens of burdens of proof. Carlos Alchourrón (Loui 1997), Claire Finkelstein (1999), and Jorge Rodríguez (2012), among others, all duly noted in footnotes and the bibliography, had earlier either identified the phenomenon or offered analyses that are similar in broad brush to that developed by d'Almeida. D'Almeida, however, elaborates his arguments not only at considerably greater length, but also with a degree of precision and rigor in argumentation not found in the works of his predecessors.

Under what d'Almeida characterizes as the "common view" (pp. 138-142), a view he (correctly) attributes to me (1991) and a number of others, the very idea of an exception is a topic of potentially limited philosophical, theoretical, or jurisprudential interest. If most rules with exceptions can be rewritten such that the potential exceptions or defeating conditions can be rewritten so as to incorporate the absence of defeating conditions into the primary operative part of the rule -- "People who are not driving to the hospital while pregnant or ill must not drive in excess of 60 miles per hour" -- then the very idea of defeasibility adds little to what we otherwise know about the operation of rules and of law.

Conversely, it is the very possibility of recasting a rule and its exceptions, as noted above, that calls into question the opposing traditional view that the possibility of rules being defeated tells us something deep and important about law and other normative systems that allow for exceptions. Hart may have held such a view in 1949 when he first attached the label "defeasible" to legal rules that could be defeated by exceptions, and in subsequent writing he used the idea of defeasibility to distinguish law from many other systems of rules.

In finding both of these positions wanting, d'Almeida is scrupulously fair to and careful with the views he rejects, developing them at length and often making them better then when they were first offered. In this respect, as well as in the exhaustive documentation offered in the footnotes and the bibliography, the book is a model of scholarly craft, even apart from its virtues in analyzing the problem it seeks to address.

D'Almeida's "solution" for the problem of defeasibility focuses, as have several before it, on the idea of the burden of proof. Consider, for example, the difference between a sign saying, "Keep off the grass" and another sign saying, as I recall it from my days as a private in the Army, "You are not authorized to walk on the grass." With the appropriate linguistic embellishment, we might see the two as virtually identical, but that would miss something important about the difference between the two signs, with the former suggesting a background regime of freedom of action and movement to which this particular plot is an exception, and the latter serving as a reminder of a background regime of prohibition including this plot and many others.

If this difference between "you can do anything unless it is prohibited" and "you can do nothing unless you are authorized" has some resonance, then we can understand the broader importance of the burden of proof. The operative portion of a rule typically, d'Almeida argues, represents the basic import of the rule, and the defeating conditions detract under some circumstances from that basic import. And thus, whether in law or in ordinary rule-based non-legal life, we would expect the proponent of a rule's restriction to have the burden of showing that the rule regulates some behavior at issue, but, that having been shown, the burden then shifts to the subject to demonstrate that he or she is entitled to escape the rule's mandates. The nature of the burdens will of course vary from rule to rule and from normative system to normative system. In the criminal law, for example, much turns on whether a defendant claiming self-defense must show self-defense by a preponderance of the evidence, by clear and convincing evidence, or even, hypothetically, by proof beyond a reasonable doubt. And much also turns on whether a defendant, having raised the possibility of self-defense, must then show by a preponderance of the evidence, say, that he acted in self-defense, or whether, the defendant having raised self-defense, the burden remains with the prosecution, which must then show the absence of self-defense by proving it beyond a reasonable doubt. And in explaining the intersection of defenses, defeaters, and exceptions in criminal law, in law generally, and for rules generally by use of the idea of the burden of proof, d'Almeida has not only offered a more than plausible solution to the problem he has set out to solve, and has not only done so with admirable rigor, but has also made a substantial contribution to the literature on rules more generally.

It is often the case that rigor and precision come at the expense of breadth, and this tradeoff is apparent in this book. D'Almeida understands the problem he sets out to solve largely as Hart understood it in 1949 (pp. 20-21 n.44), and in doing so he consciously almost completely brackets a host of important issues that these days, even if not in 1949, tend to be discussed in the language of defeasibility. Most important of these, perhaps, is the question of genuine open texture (Schauer 2013). When Hart first wrote about defeasibility in 1949, Friedrich Waismann's (1945) identification of the phenomenon of open texture -- not vagueness, but the ineliminable possibility of potential vagueness of even the most precise language in the face of an uncertain world -- had only recently been published, and we do not know how well Hart knew Waismann at Oxford or whether Hart was even aware of the idea of open texture in 1949. By 1961, however, when Hart published The Concept of Law, he was plainly knowledgeable about Waismann's article and ideas, and noted in The Concept of Law that not only could a rule still be a rule if it contained an unless clause or clauses, but that the rule was still a rule even if the list of possible "unless-es" could not be specified in advance. This last is the problem of open texture in law (and elsewhere), and it has generated a rich literature, often under the heading of defeasibility, that is largely focused on whether it is inherent in the nature of law that new exceptions can always be added even if they were nowhere mentioned earlier, with authors such as Richard Posner and Richard Tur claiming that that is the case, while others, including this reviewer (1998; 2012), have argued, that such a feature is a contingent aspect of some legal systems at some times and is inherent in neither the nature of law nor the nature of rules. D'Almeida, however, treating Hart's 1949 specification of the defeasibility problem as authoritative, puts the problem just described off to one side, despite it now being thought of as part of a cluster of defeasibility issues.

There are other aspects of what is now understood as the problem of defeasibility that d'Almeida also treats as beyond the scope of this book. He does not, for example, set out to analyze the distinction between a rule being considered inapplicable because of the failure of its triggering conditions or its rationale and a rule being considered inoperative even if applicable because it is overridden (pp. 179-181) in some circumstance by other more important (in this case) considerations. There is a difference, for example, between the non-violation of a 20 mph speed limit because the subject was running on foot and not operating a vehicle and the non-violation because the operator was operating a vehicle for the purpose of taking a gravely wounded person to the hospital. It is plausible that in the former case the rule is deemed inapplicable and in the latter the rule is taken to be overridden, and the difference between the two is important, even if not to d'Almeida here. Similarly, it is important in understanding law to distinguish defeating conditions that come from inside the law from those that intrude from morality or other non-legal domains, and this question, again often debated under the heading of defeasibility, and perhaps mostly associated with debates between Ronald Dworkin (1977; 1986) and his critics, is not what d'Almeida deems worth concentrating on in this book.

It is of course too easy to criticize an author for not having written a different book with different aims. Still, because the topics that d'Almeida does not treat, or mentions only for the purpose of relegating them to the sidelines, are ones that are often discussed under the heading of defeasibility, and are ones that relate so closely to the precise subject that d'Almeida does address, it is worth noting that a reader wishing for more breadth of coverage -- for an analysis of all or most of what is thought of as defeasibility today, even if it was not what Hart was thinking of in 1949 -- is likely to be disappointed.

This quibble about breadth should not be taken to detract from the quality and importance of what d'Almeida has written and accomplished. This book is, to repeat, a tightly argued and scrupulously fair treatment of how we should understand the logical, linguistic, normative, and institutional relationship between rules and their exceptions. As such it deserves to be read and absorbed by anyone interested in deontic logic, artificial intelligence, the operation of legal (and other) rules, and the characteristics of normative systems generally, whether those be the normative systems of law, of games, of etiquette, or even of morality.


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