Almost Over: Aging, Dying, Dead

Almost Over Aging Dying Death

F. M. Kamm, Almost Over: Aging, Dying, Dead, Oxford University Press, 2020, 330pp., $35.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190097158.

Reviewed by Christopher Belshaw, University of York


F. M. Kamm’s latest book is a semi-compilation—eight chapters, almost all of which are, to different degrees, refashionings of earlier materials. So then it is neither a collection of extant writings nor a wholly new work, but something in between, dealing, in a loosely structured fashion, with various issues relating to death and dying.

It begins with some broad and long-standing questions about the badness of death and ends, with asking what the state—and here Kamm has in mind just the US state—should require, permit, or forbid regarding suicide and euthanasia. Intermediate chapters are concerned, inter alia, with how death affects meaning, end of life care and how to plan for it, and to what extent we should try to stave off the inevitable. A middle chapter—think of it somewhat like a sorbet or palate cleanser in a long and heavy meal—attends in particular to the ageing process and invites speculation (the prompt here is Scott Fitzgeralds’s Benjamin Buttons) about its being reversed.

Not only does the book run from the general to the particular, or from philosophy in its purer to its more practical and applied form—which accordingly is mixed here with law, politics, and current affairs—but it shifts from the pretty much free-standing to discussions increasingly dependent on input from elsewhere. In the first chapter Kamm addresses her questions directly, and with really very little call on other voices. References here are mostly to professional philosophers of some stature. The last chapter, in a pronounced contrast, interrogates in painstaking detail the views on physician assisted suicide and euthanasia put forth at various times by ‘a major figure in US health policy’ (ix), oncologist and bioethicist Ezekiel Emmanuel. Kamm’s own views here are not easy to discern. The transition is gradual. Some of Shelley Kagan’s arguments from his book Death are the main focus of Chapter 2 and David Velleman makes a more than passing appearance in Chapter 7. But elsewhere, Kamm’s interlocuters, or hapless victims of her unyielding analysis, are mostly public figures—Atul Gawande and Neil Gorsuch as well as Emmanuel—who, as might be expected, are ill-equipped, either by training, inclination, or career demands, to withstand it.

I’ll come back later to what we might make of this, but meanwhile, and to give that later comment some support, I’ll say more about first, Chapter 1 and second, the thematically linked Chapters 7 and 8. Together these comprise about a third of the book.

We can ask, when is death bad for the one who dies? Epicureans, holding that death brings to an end all feelings, awareness, thought, and existence itself, say it’s never bad. This is hard to believe. The Deprivation View says, seemingly plausibly, that it is bad not only to feel pain but also to lose out on, or be deprived of, pleasures. That there is no pain for the dead doesn’t, then, establish that death isn’t bad. And probably most philosophers will sign up to the Deprivation View, or what is here called Deprivationism, in some form or other.

Kamm, exploiting her fondness for awkward-sounding neologisms, identifies and discusses three claims, all of which suggest weaknesses in Deprivationism. First, there is Willhavehadism—it is worse to die at 20 than 50 as one would have had more of life in the latter case. Then Alloverism—dying a year from now might be worse than being in a coma for a hundred years, coming round, and then dying a year later. And Insultism—death takes from us not just the future, but a life, something we already had. 

It's worth discussing each of these in a little more detail.

Willhavehadism. Suppose that if you don’t die, you’ll have 10 more years of good life. So then death now is bad, according to Deprivationism. Is it worse to die at 20 than 50 if in both cases you lose 10 good years? Kamm says it is. But why think the Deprivationist would say anything different? Surely the plausible claim is merely that death’s badness is proportional to the goods lost, other things equal. And they are not equal when between two people the age of death differs. This isn’t some last ditch, up against the wall attempt to rescue Deprivationism. The driving idea is that when life is good then more of it is better. This is why even a painless death, in robbing us of this good, is bad for us. It is surely implicit in Deprivationism, from the outset, that it is worse to die at 20 than at 50, worse to have had the smaller amount of good life.

Alloverism. Going out of existence, and forever, is what some of us most dread. And Kamm’s Limbo Man prefers to put this off as long as possible. I might simply make the above point again: having your last year now, or having it a century later, is not a case where other things are equal. So Deprivationism need make no claim that these options are equally bad. But I might instead argue that Limbo Man makes a mistake: it is better to have your last year now, in familiar circumstances, than to have it many years hence, and in utterly alien territory. Suppose we imagine that time continues, but all earthly activity is put on hold for a century. Limbo Man gets what he, on reflection, decides he wants—a good year wholly indiscernible from that available to him now, but, and undetectably, a hundred years later. There is, though, no reason to want this.

Insultism. This is harder. There are, it seems, two ways in which we can be deprived of some portion of a good life; either by keeping birth fixed, but then dying, and going out of existence earlier, or by keeping death fixed, and coming into existence later. But there is an asymmetry here: a shorter life caused by an earlier death seems to be worse than one caused by a later birth. So then we haven’t adequately explained the badness of death merely by pointing to the good life lost. Kamm fills the gap. Unlike pre-natal non-existence, death happens to a person, destroys that person, takes from the person something—a life—that they had, involves a decline from a good to at least a neutral state, and ends all hope of a good future. These are, she says, death’s insult factors.

Now I think there is something in this as a criticism of Deprivationism. But Kamm’s discussion is complex, perhaps needlessly so, and requires considerable unpacking. What I can most usefully do here is offer a connected but simpler account of Deprivationism’s shortcomings. And then the relations between this, and Kamm’s contentions might be explored.

Imagine a newly formed human embryo. Is it bad for the embryo not to develop into one of us, and then live a good life, but instead die? Is death really bad for a cat which, if it lives, will have future pleasures, but doesn’t, and can’t, have the coherent package of experiences which we might call a life? And is it bad for the Alzheimer’s patient who similarly has pleasures ahead, but who also lacks, though until recently did have, such a life? There are good reasons, I believe, for denying that death is bad in these cases, and for suggesting that badness emerges only when it takes from us future goods which, even now, we desire to have. So then death is bad only for persons, and not for animals or for human beings in whom personhood is either undeveloped or irretrievably gone.

This represents an important restriction on Deprivationism—taking away a good life is a necessary, but not sufficient condition of death’s badness. And it at least links, surely, with Insultism. Putting persons centre stage, and then attending to what they lose, rather than simply fail to get, as a consequence of death, is what Deprivationism misses. Is there more to Insultism than this? If and where there’s more, is Insultism correct in its claims? To get answers here we’d need to delve more deeply into Kamm. This isn’t the place.

It is, I think, a decided weakness of Kamm’s book that there is no explicit discussion of personhood, how it figures in differences between humans and other animals, and indeed between human beings themselves, and how it impacts death’s badness. And this despite countless references to persons. For most of these are vague, with the term being used not in some Lockean sense but, apparently, as a mere synonym for human being, or the singular of people.

The chapter ends with a discussion of our extinction, and how that might, or might not, be a bad thing. Unfortunately, this is too flimsy to be of real value.

I said earlier that this opening chapter is free standing. Well, in one sense it is—it’s pretty much all Kamm—while in another sense it’s not—it’s far from all of Kamm. She’s written on these topics, in detail and at length, in various other places. And what might at first glance appear here as complete arguments can instead be seen as summaries of, comments on, or pointers to arguments elsewhere. So then it might be objected that my criticisms here are less than fair, with effective rejoinders to be found in her other writings.

Chapter 7—Five Easy Arguments for Assisted Suicide and the Objections of Velleman and Gorsuch has, as here suggested, an overall clear structure. The arguments claim to show that at least in many circumstances a doctor is morally permitted to intentionally cause her patient’s death. Velleman objects that life has a value such that this claim is false. Gorsuch making much of the Doctrine of Double Effect, allows that foreseeing death is one thing, intending it quite another.

There are, however, two questions that might be asked about this title. First, what makes an argument easy? Is it easy to follow, easy to agree with? Kamm doesn’t say. But though they all have similar four-step structure the arguments are hardly straightforward. Kamm has reservations about at least one, and there’s much room for doubt—I’ll return to this—about another. Second, what happened to euthanasia? Both this and the following chapter are sometimes said to be concerned with physician assisted suicide, or PAS, sometimes with both PAS and euthanasia, E, also. There’s an important difference here that Kamm notes. Euthanasia is for the good of the patient, it is in his best interests; suicide might not be. But there’s another difference. Suicide seems to involve, by definition, someone’s choice, or intent. Euthanasia doesn’t. But Kamm wants throughout both chapters to limit the discussion to cases involving free and informed consent. So then much that might be said, and surely needs to be said, about euthanasia is absent. For someone might think the clearest and strongest case for ending a life is when the life to be ended is not that of a person. Euthanasia for animals is accepted; and we should most obviously accept it for people when personhood is gone, and consenting, or not, is no longer at issue. It is regrettable that this big and important topic is so little discussed.

Velleman objects to all aiming at, or intending death. Even when life is no longer good for someone, it can still be good that this someone, and their life, continues. For life is intrinsically valuable. Kamm makes the obvious and telling objections to this. But a detail of some importance is overlooked. The claim that life has intrinsic value is one thing, that it has this value whatever its condition, quite another. This is why the argument for aborting a healthy fetus is harder to make than that for euthanizing an old person, in great pain, and at death’s door.

Velleman is introduced, considered and dispatched in under four pages; Gorsuch, wanting to distinguish between intending and foreseeing death, and disallowing only the first, gets about fifteen. Kamm demonstrates considerable patience in following and teasing apart the details of his arguments here, and yet, as we might expect, finds them wanting. There are links to the discussion of Velleman; the importance of intrinsic value is limited—‘we may intentionally destroy an artwork to save human lives or even other art works’—and it’s the same with life: there’s just no good defence to be made of Gorsuch’s: ‘inviolability of life principle’ (231).

Why devote almost all of Chapter 8 to exploring, in intricate and indiscriminate detail, the shifting positions of Emmanuel? Because, as ‘a prominent architect of public health policy’, his views ‘exemplify a type of position (on PAS and E) that might be held by others’ (245). So then rather than presenting a clear case for legalizing PAS, and then identifying, explicating and countering the strongest arguments against that case, Kamm opts for an altogether more circuitous route, wherein a major concern is to say what Emmanuel, in around two decades of involvement with these matters, might in the end have said, had he been consistent. There are of course other tasks she undertakes along the way. One is to prise apart talk of rights and wrongs from that of benefits and harms; Emmanuel, she says, is too much concerned with just the latter and, moreover, makes implausible claims about how much harm will ensue if such suicide is allowed. Another connected task she undertakes is to explore some parallels between PAS and capital punishment where side effect harms are concerned. Is this really useful? There’s room for doubt.

I’ll now offer three suggestions as to areas which might have been more fully explored, following in part from points made earlier. (1) The links between PAS and, on the one hand, withdrawal of treatment and, on the other, euthanasia could usefully be made more explicit. And then it might plausibly be argued, first, that anyone allowing withdrawal of treatment (where the intention is typically to hasten death) is going to be hard pressed to disallow PAS; and second, that ‘PAS will slope into euthanasia’ should be seen as an observation and not a complaint. (2) The easy argument for a doctor having sometimes a duty to carry out PAS (in Chapter 7) is the one about which I have reservations. But this is of little importance if we require not only that the state permits PAS but also that it ensures that there is the means, the finances, and the personnel to provide it when required. Again, there’s a parallel point to be made about abortion. (3) Kamm surely succeeds in revealing several weaknesses in arguments against PAS. This, many will think, is not a great achievement. What perhaps needs more consideration is to what extent the dictates of religion sit behind reactionary and conservative views, and what to do about this.

A review should attend not only to the thoughts, words, and arguments of the author but also to their organization and presentation on the page. This book’s deriving from various earlier materials leads, perhaps inevitably, both to much repetition and to an unsystematic presentation of key ideas. And the trend towards light touch editing is taken too far. There’s a disturbing number of small and easily avoided errors scattered throughout—inconsistencies in name spelling, in endnote style, references within and beyond the book. Emmanuel is for some reason referred to, more or less throughout, as EE. More important are the obstacles to comprehension: even something as simple as a more generous sprinkling of commas would make many of the sentences easier to grasp, there is just too little signposting, and the layout appears not to have been much thought about. Chapter 7 begins well, with clear headings, judicious use of italics, typefaces, spacing, and indents. Yet in its second half all this is abandoned and instead there’s twenty pages of virtually seamless prose. The chapter then ends abruptly, with no attempt at a summary or conclusion.

A final gripe: a claim on the dustjacket—and surely it’s OUP rather than Kamm who is responsible for this—tells us that ‘Almost Over is a must read for scholars and students in bioethics, and for anyone interested in death, euthanasia, or assisted suicide.’ Yet there are millions of such people. And although there are considerable rewards on offer to the readers of this book, there’s very considerable investment needed to have a hope of getting them. Only small numbers, only aficionados, will want to give Kamm the time and attention that any profiting from her work requires. This is regrettable. What is sorely needed is a strong and clear case, and one that we might expect will be noticed and taken up by policy makers, first for the moral acceptability, and then for the legalization (though of course only in some circumstances) of PAS and euthanasia. That case isn’t made here.