Althusser's Lesson

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Jacques Rancière, Althusser's Lesson, Emiliano Battista (tr.), Continuum, 2011, 199pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781441108050.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Althusser's Lesson is Jacques Rancière's first book. It would not be hyperbolic to say that it is polemically written. One might, without inaccuracy, see it as Rancière's public announcement of a break with his former teacher. However, the book is more than a break. It is a historical and political analysis of the French left of the 1960s and 1970s as well as a glimpse into the themes that will preoccupy Rancière's thought for the following two decades.

The book is structured as a series of four "lessons," followed by a concluding chapter. There is also an appendix, a curious one, as Rancière notes in his preface to the English edition. It represents what he calls his "first attempt at formulating a critique of Althusserianism on the morning of the events of May 68." (p. xxiii) I will concentrate here on the lessons themselves. But by way of prefatory remarks, I should note that, previous to the events of May 68, Rancière was one of the star students in Althusser's intellectual stable (others included Alain Badiou and Etienne Balibar). He had an essay in Althusser's seminal work Reading Capital, and was considered among the brightest of those who would carry on the Althusserian legacy. Like many, Rancière changed his view of Althusser and of the French Communist Party (PCF) generally in the wake of May 68, largely because of the critique the communists made of the events themselves. For Althusser and others of the PCF, May 68 was a student rebellion rather than a true communist one, largely because if it were the latter it would have been led by the PCF. Indeed, the PCF was entirely uninvolved in the "events of May" except to denounce them, and its precipitous decline in influence on the French left can be dated precisely to that period.

As is clear from Althusser's Lesson, the leftist pressure placed upon the PCF came largely from the growing influence of Maoism, particularly among the students in the circles in which Rancière traveled. There is a strong Maoist inflection in the book, one that derives in part from a reading of the Cultural Revolution that Rancière notes in his preface turned out to be a misreading. Unlike Alain Badiou, who continues to defend at least the early days of the Cultural Revolution, Rancière has distanced himself from it (without, however, reducing it to a political ploy by Mao himself). He writes,

history has taught us not only the limits of the autonomous capacity for initiative attributable to the actors of the Cultural Revolution, it has also revealed the penitentiary realities that accompanied the theses about the re-education of intellectuals through manual labor . . . the book bears out, at its own expense, the thesis that there is no theory of subversion that cannot also serve the cause of oppression. (p. xvii)

What characterizes the political career of Rancière's thought is the attempt to take the truth that he saw nascent in the Cultural Revolution -- that people don't need intellectual masters -- and embed it in a thought that would more likely resist "the cause of oppression." This truth finds expression in Rancière's conception of politics as collective action under the presupposition of the equality of all speaking beings, a conception that finds its most rigorous articulation in his 1995 book Disagreement.

The four lessons in the current book are, as the chapter titles announce, lessons in orthodoxy, politics, self-criticism, and history. Each of them is directed toward an aspect of Althusser's thought, although, as Rancière notes at the outset, the point of the book is not to give an overview of that thought but rather to focus on a particular element of it: its requirement of the guidance of an intellectual class. Thus, common themes from Althusser's thought, such as overdetermination, determination in the last instance, and interpellation, are neglected or given short shrift, while others, such as process without a subject, occupy center stage.

The first lesson is one that is given to Althusser's orthodoxy. It is a lesson given to a lesson, since it treats a lesson that Althusser offers to the British Marxist John Lewis in his 1973 book (one year previous to the appearance of Althusser's Lesson) Reply to John Lewis. In the Reply, Althusser criticizes Lewis for thinking that "man makes history." This, as students of Althusser's thought will immediately recognize, is a thesis grounded in a humanism that Althusser rejects during the entirety of his career. Instead, Althusser teaches, it is "the masses" who make history. Rancière treatment of Althusser's critique, his first "lesson," unfolds in three stages. First, he argues that the subject of history was never a concern for pre-Marxist bourgeois thought, which was instead focused on the nature of Man. Second, he notes that, for Marx, the problem with thinking that "man" makes history is that it absolutizes the concept of men into Man. For Marx, "it is not Man who makes history, but men -- concrete individuals, those who produce the means of their existence, the ones who fight in the class struggle." (p. 7) Finally, and most important, Althusser uses his critique of humanism, of Man, to resist the Marxist thesis (inflected by Rancière in a Maoist direction) that the masses make history as concrete individuals acting on the basis of their equality to intellectuals. According to Althusser, the masses act under the ideology of Man, thinking that they can be the subject of history. But instead history is, in Althusser's famous formulation, a "process without a subject." It requires the intellectuals to know this and the leadership of the Party to act upon it.

The second chapter, the lesson in politics, traces the history of Althusser's writings, their relation to the PCF, and their effect upon the youth of the pre-May 68 period. It is a chapter filled with historical detail, but its political lesson is straightforward. The highly theoretical character of Althusser's writings did not have the effect of removing students from politics, but instead of inflecting their politics in a certain direction. That direction was one that ultimately lent support to the PCF, but in a complex way.

On the one hand, Reading Capital presented theses that amounted to a political critique of the Party. The break with an evolutionist conception of history, the affirmation of the discontinuity of modes of production . . . the radical originality of the problem of transition -- all of these theses tended, logically, towards a denunciation of the PCF's economism, as well as of the notion of the peaceful transition to socialism and of a 'true democracy.' (pp. 46-47)

On the other hand, however, the "theoreticist" orientation of the critique required the young intellectuals around Althusser to disengage themselves from struggle and engage instead in the clarification of ideas. This, in turn, had the effect of reinforcing the legitimacy of the PCF. The PCF could display itself as a Party that allowed for rigorous critical work among its young intellectuals, as long as that work focused on the ideas themselves and not any consequences those ideas might have for the Party. As Rancière points out, in the analyses of the young intellectuals gathered around Althusser, the effects of power of their own discourse went unaddressed. (Here, as elsewhere in the book, one notes the influence, at points openly acknowledged, of Foucault's emerging views on power-knowledge.)

The third lesson, which concerns self-criticism, picks up Althusser's history when he engages in his self-critical retreat from the theoreticism of his writings of the mid-1960s. Althusser's thought, even in its abstraction from practice, was necessarily in tension with some of the PCF's central tenets. This eventually required a "rectification," one that drove Althusser to re-orient important elements of his thought. Now, instead of seeing the implications of his work as affecting the wider arena of political struggle, it would be a matter of directing it more narrowly toward epistemological practices. Philosophy would be the "class struggle in theory." This struggle incorporated elements of Maoism in that it no longer accused the sciences of being necessarily blind, but instead of being turned away from their naturally good spontaneity by the idealism of bourgeois philosophical ideology. Casting matters this way allowed Althusser to place more faith in the masses and the Party that represents them, since it granted a spontaneous self-understanding nascent in scientific practice. At the same time, however, it still retained a critical role for philosophy, for the intellectuals: that of battling against the idealist illusions that layered over and obfuscated that spontaneous self-understanding. "Scientists had to be shown that their worries stemmed from the fact that their sciences were being exploited -- not by bosses, governments, or war hawks, but by philosophies. And against that, of course, the sciences needed philosophical weapons." (p. 64) Althusserianism, then, becomes a policing of concepts, one that turns Maoism against itself. Instead of removing the intellectuals from academia and exposing them to the working environment, one instead posited academia as its own site of class struggle. "There was no need to 'take philosophy out of the lecture halls,' for class struggle was in those halls." (p. 73) In this struggle, of course, the working class itself makes no appearance.

The fourth and final lesson is one in history. It is a lesson in the history of words and doctrines. At the beginning of the chapter, Rancière takes issue with Althusser's critique of humanism by showing the historical role played by the word "man" in nineteenth- and twentieth-century worker struggles. Far from being simply an element of bourgeois ideology, workers often invoked the idea of man in order to assert their own dignity. "Man is not the mask that derails the struggle but the rallying call that effects the transition from labour practices that grant control over the labour process to the appropriation of the means of production." (p. 90) And just as the concept of man is historical rather than eternal, so the interpretation and uptake of Marx's writings. "What Marx's theory must produce is not emblazoned on its forehead." (p. 104) Althusser's attempt to recover the true Marx, then, and his accusation of deviation against those who interpret or utilize his work differently, is an ahistorical maneuver. Moreover, it is a maneuver that, once again, delivers Marx into the hands of the intellectual elite and removes him from the practical, engaged activity of the working class.

Rancière's conclusion, a harsh one in keeping with the polemical tone of the book, accuses Althusserian thought of seeking to speak from no place in particular, that is, from above the historical context that would constrain it, to assume a God-like point of view.

A discourse that allows one to speak for others, that cancels out the place and subject of its own speech: such is the mechanism that has found its paradigmatic form in Althusserian discourse, founded as it is on the denial of the place from which it speaks, of what is speaks about, and of who it speaks to. (p. 122)

What Rancière calls for, then, and what will become a persistent theme in his own work, is the rejection of the role of the intellectual as one of telling people who they are, who they should be, and how they should become it. After Althusser's Lesson, Rancière spends several years in the archives before producing, in 1981, Nights of Labor, a book that tries to capture workers' goals and aspirations in their own words, outside of their emplacement in a particular theory of labor consciousness.

How should we take Althusser's Lesson, a book whose goal is not only analytical but clearly personal, an attempt to distance oneself from one's erstwhile mentor? Read as a book of philosophy, which it is clearly not meant to be, it is pretty thin. It suggests readings of Marx as more egalitarian than the authoritarian strains of Marxist theory would have it, and reminds us that appropriations of Marx -- as Marx himself knew -- could not escape the constraints of the history in which they occur. However, these ideas are not developed (and modified) until Rancière's more mature works of the 1990s. As a book of history, it offers insight into the debates and discussions that animated the Marxist left during the crucial period surrounding the events of May 68. As Rancière's first book, it allows us to glimpse the early steps, however halting and indebted to an event from which he would later distance himself -- the Cultural Revolution -- in the direction of the radical egalitarianism that would become a hallmark of his political thought. It is, in the end, not the book to start with if one is interested in Rancière's significant contributions to contemporary political thought. However, if one wishes to understand the seeds of those contributions, and the times in which they were germinating, Althusser's Lesson offers as good a first-hand account as one could ask for.