Alvin Plantinga

Placeholder book cover

Dean-Peter Baker (ed.), Alvin Plantinga, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 233pp., $25.99 (pbk) ISBN 9780521671439.

Reviewed by Edward Wierenga, University of Rochester


 This volume is one of a series of books, Cambridge Philosophy in Focus, that consist of "newly commissioned essays that cover major contributions of a preeminent philosopher in a systematic and accessible manner." Many of the essays in the present volume do indeed "combine exposition and critical analysis" in a way that will be of interest not only to professional philosophers but also to students or others who are unfamiliar with Plantinga's work.

The book begins with an introduction by the editor that first traces Plantinga's career and influence1 and then introduces the eight essays that follow.

The first of these essays, by Graham Oppy, is ostensibly about changes in what Plantinga takes to be the aim of natural theology and changes in his attitude towards it. But in the course of developing those points, Oppy lays out exceptionally clear summaries of positions Plantinga has taken, beginning with God and Other Minds (1967), continuing through God, Freedom, and Evil (1974) and The Nature of Necessity (1974), then on to "Reason and Belief in God" (1983), "The Prospects for Natural Theology" (1991), and "Two Dozen (or So) Theistic Arguments" (1986, see below), and concluding with Warrant and Proper Function (1993) and Warranted Christian Belief (2000). Oppy's summaries often go beyond the limited topic of natural theology (and natural atheology), situating these issues in the broader context of Plantinga's work. Oppy argues that in his earliest work, Plantinga takes natural theology to be the attempt to prove that God exists; Plantinga takes this project to be a failure but irrelevant to reasonableness of belief in God. In later work, Plantinga more often conceives of natural theology as the attempt to show the rationality of theistic belief. Here he sometimes seems to think it can do that, but in Warranted Christian Belief holds that it can do so if theism is correct. Oppy also claims that Plantinga pretty consistently takes natural atheology to be the attempt to prove that God does not exist (rather than the attempt to show the reasonableness of atheism); unsurprisingly, he thinks that this project is a complete failure.

Richard Gale gives a summary of Plantinga's long concern with the problem of evil, and he offers several objections to Plantinga's positions. Early in his career, the form of the objection that dominated the literature was the logical problem of evil, the claim that God's existence is logically incompatible with the existence of evil. In response, Plantinga developed several versions of the Free Will Defense. This involved an appeal to the value of created agents freely doing what is right; the claim that moral evil resulting from the free actions of creatures could be justified by the value of the freely chosen good that they do; and the claim that possibly the "counterfactuals of freedom", conditionals specifying what each possible person would do in various circumstances, line up in such a way that no matter which free creatures God creates, they do some wrong. A standard objection to this account is that these counterfactuals of freedom are not true, but Gale defends Plantinga against this charge. Instead, Gale claims, implausibly I believe, that if one agent does something in ignorance that results in a second agent doing a certain thing, then the first agent is not a cause of the second agent's action. Nevertheless if the first agent has "middle knowledge" of what the second agent would do, then the first agent is a "sufficient cause" of the second agent's action. Given that according to the Free Will Defense God is supposed to have middle knowledge of what creatures would do if created, he has, according to Gale, "freedom-cancelling control" over them (56). This seems to blur a distinction between being a cause of something and being responsible for it. Gale speaks of apportioning responsibility and blame, but insisting that God is a sufficient cause of a creature's actions is not required for that. Indeed, the Free Will Defender does attribute a certain responsibility for what creatures do to God, but the Defender insists that God has a morally sufficient justification for it. Plantinga extends the Free Will Defense to natural evil by holding that it is possible that all natural evil (destructive floods and earthquakes, for example) is really moral evil, because it is possible that it is evil resulting from the free actions of non-human agents, namely, Satan and his minions. Many philosophers object to this extension (wrongly, in my view) on the grounds that it is implausible, but it is possibility not plausibility that is relevant here. Gale gives a different but interesting objection. He claims that

theists [need to] come up with a defense for natural evils; for, given that theists grant that it is at least logically or conceptually possible for God and natural evil to coexist, they must find some possible morally exonerating justification for God permitting natural evils, even if they do not actually exist (48).

I do not know what Plantinga would say about this objection, but it is at least open to question whether theists do hold that it is logically possible for God and natural evils to coexist. What is clear is that most theists think, say, that the occurrence of earthquakes and floods is compatible with the existence of God. It is less clear that they are committed to holding that such events are not, or possibly are not, the effects of the free actions of nonhuman agents. (In any event, other versions of the Free Will Defense, in particular those given by Richard Swinburne and Peter van Inwagen, do attempt to justify natural evils on the grounds that the regular operation of natural laws is required for significant exercise of free will.)

A second version of the problem of evil, the evidential problem of evil, holds that even if the existence of evil is compatible with the existence of God, it nevertheless counts against God's existence. Largely because Plantinga's work on the logical problem of evil was so convincing, many philosophers turned to the claim that evil (or unjustified evil) is evidence against God's existence. Gale describes the development of Plantinga's treatment of the evidential problem, culminating in a discussion of a strand in Plantinga's thought that has long been present. Gale calls it "theistic skepticism" (a better term than the more common "skeptical theism"); this is the view that human cognitive powers are too limited to be able to tell what God's reason is for permitting various evils, and thus we are unable to see that he is not justified in permitting them. Gale presents several objections to this view, including the claims that "it seems to require that we become complete moral skeptics" and that it seems not to allow for "a meaningful love relationship with God" (67). These are serious objections, and they require more space than I have here to address. On the former, let me simply observe that it should not follow from the fact that we cannot tell what alternatives God has open to him and what the value of each of those actions is that we are not in a position to make a more restricted judgment about a vastly smaller set of alternative actions open to us.2

John Divers presents the details of Plantinga's modal metaphysics, which he takes as offering answers to such questions as "whether there is a modal reality … , whether such a modal [reality] consists in irreducibly modal facts … ; [and] whether modal facts consist (partly) in the existence of objects or properties of a special kind" (71). Divers begins by describing Plantinga's rejection of Quine's strictures against modality and then continues by contrasting Plantinga's treatment with that of David Lewis. Plantinga's theory is "realist", "thoroughly antiempiricist", and "almost as … robust as such a theory could be"; it holds that modal facts are not reducible to non-modal ones, and that there such special objects as modal properties, for example, being necessarily F (75). Curiously, Divers attributes to Plantinga the admission of impossible worlds. These would be "states of affairs that are maximal and that instantiate the property of not possibly obtaining -- as a world will, for example, when it includes the existence of Socrates and the nonexistence of Socrates" (80). I wish that Divers had included more defense of this claim, since I understand Plantinga's canonical account of possible worlds to be maximally consistent states of affairs, and a state of affairs that includes both the existence and the nonexistence of Socrates is not consistent. Although Divers raises several potential objections, he concludes that "Plantinga's body of work on the metaphysics of modality is rich, subtle, and at the very forefront of the field" (88).

Plantinga's argument against naturalism holds that if our epistemic faculties developed through evolutionary factors aimed at reproductive success, then the probability that our epistemic faculties are a reliable source of true beliefs is either very low or inscrutable. This defeats any belief in the reliability of our faculties and any belief arising from those faculties. But, according to the naturalist, belief in naturalism is one of those beliefs. So naturalism defeats itself. Ernest Sosa broadens this argument to include any "brute" origin of our epistemic faculties, and he shows how it is a nice reversal of the standard naturalist (Nietzsche, Freud, Marx) objection to religious belief that attacks its source. Sosa takes the argument seriously and suggests that if "we have no basis for supposing that things have turned out well enough for our faculties … [i]t would put us in an epistemic situation about as bad as if we knew that we had taken a pill that nearly always disables one's faculties terminally" (102). Sosa concludes by sketching a reply, however. He claims that believing that our faculties are unreliable or suspending judgment on the question is also self-defeating, since we can not coherently commit to those attitudes (105). We have no alternative, then, but to commit to the reliability of our faculties, and, having done that, to draw out the consequences of doing so. I do not see, on the one hand, why it is permissible simply to commit to the reliability of our faculties -- there is no alternative to belief, disbelief, and withholding, but coherent commitment does not seem to be similarly forced -- and on the other, given Sosa's forceful development of the point, why he merely holds that it is a strategy the naturalist "might" employ.

The essays by Oppy, Gale, and Sosa all touch on topics treated in Warranted Christian Belief. Another trio of essays address issues in Plantinga's epistemology more directly. Jonathan Kvanvig introduces a distinction between two kinds of defeat, which he calls "front door" and "back door". The latter is Plantinga's official view, according to which defeat is to be understood in terms of required changes to a person's set of beliefs and doxastic structure. Kvanvig claims that in practice Plantinga uses the "front door" concept, according to which defeat is to be understood simply in terms of certain relations between propositions, and that this is the approach to be preferred.

James Beilby develops a sustained critique of Plantinga's Extended A/C [Aquinas/Calvin] Model of Christian belief, a model according to which such belief, if true, is warranted and therefore knowledge. Beilby has high praise for this proposal: it "represents the most complete and comprehensive attempt to think through important philosophical issues from a distinctively Christian point of view", but he also holds that the proposal is "incomplete" (158). In particular, he objects to Plantinga's "unwillingness to argue for the truth of his model, his reference to the faith of 'paradigmatic' believers rather than that of typical believers, and his unwillingness to flesh out … controversial theological details."

Kelly Clark raises a concern about the bearing of religious diversity on a Christian's warranted belief, arguing that, contrary to some critics of Plantinga, learning about religious diversity need not reduce a Christian's warrant in Christian belief, but it may do so.

Peter van Inwagen takes up Plantinga's "replacement" argument for mind-body dualism.3 Plantinga imagines a scenario in which, within a very short period of time, while he is reading the paper, all of the parts of his body are replaced by duplicates and the originals are destroyed. Plantinga holds that he would survive such a procedure, although his body would not; thus he concludes that he is not identical to his body. Van Inwagen concedes, for the sake of argument, that his body would not survive this procedure, but he denies that he would. He conjectures that Plantinga thinks otherwise because he holds that a single consciousness would continue to exist throughout the interval of the replacement procedure. This is what van Inwagen denies. More carefully, van Inwagen's modest conclusion is that he

see[s] no reason to accept … that a single, continuous conscious episode would occur during the replacement episode; therefore [he has] no reason to accept the premise of the replacement argument that the argument from continuous consciousness was supposed to establish: that I should exist throughout the replacement episode (198).

No doubt van Inwagen is right about this. A somewhat different response to Plantinga's argument is available to the four-dimensionalist. (Van Inwagen notes that both he and Plantinga are endurantists, so he does not address the alternative.) According to four-dimensionalists, a material object persists through time by perduring, that is, by having a temporal part at each time at which it exists. The perdurantist can say about the replacement case that, at each stage of replacement, the body existing then is the closest continuant of the body existing at the earlier stage, and thus the two stages are temporal parts of the same body. In that case, one's body does survive the replacements! Coupling this claim with van Inwagen's denial that he would survive the replacement yields a opposite version of Plantinga's argument: I cannot survive the replacement procedure, but my body can; therefore, I am not identical to my body. Of course, van Inwagen would deny the perdurantist assumption that leads to this conclusion.

The book concludes with an appendix, Plantinga's "Two Dozen (or So) Theistic Arguments". Plantinga distributed this manuscript to the 1986 NEH Institute in Philosophy of Religion. Since then it has been widely circulated, cited, and available online, but never officially published. It is useful to have it in a stable location, and it would be especially valuable if some philosophers would act on Plantinga's hope that "others will be moved to work [the sketches of arguments] out and develop them in detail" (203).

The volume tends to focus on Plantinga's Warranted Christian Belief. Perhaps that is unavoidable if it is, as one of the authors says, his magnum opus (125). (I would prefer to say that it is his maximum opus thus far.) But the volume also succeeds at what it aims to do. Several of the essays, especially those by Oppy, Gale, and Diver, provide good introductions to a range of Plantinga's work, and all of the essays engage that work in interesting and informative ways. It is indeed a testimony to the importance of his topics and to the penetrating quality of his thought that Plantinga's work repays the careful attention of serious philosophers.

1 One correction: Thomas Flint should not be included on a list of Plantinga's protestant graduate students (p. 8).

2 See my "How Skeptical Is Skeptical Theism?", International Conference on Philosophy of Religion: Eastern and Western Perspectives, Hong Kong, 2009.

3 Van Inwagen cites the article in which the argument is given, but without giving the bibliographic details. The article is Alvin Plantinga, "Against Materialism", Faith and Philosophy 23 (2006): 3-32.