Amartya Sen

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Christopher W. Morris (ed.), Amartya Sen, Cambridge UP, 2010, 224pp., $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521618069.

Reviewed by Andrew I. Cohen, Georgia State University



Christopher Morris’s anthology on Amartya Sen is part of the Contemporary Philosophy in Focus series from Cambridge University Press. The series offers introductions to the thought of notable recent philosophers. Sen is an excellent choice for the series. His 1998 Nobel Prize recognized his achievements in welfare economics, but his influence is also seminal in fields such as poverty and human development, ethical theory, and social and political philosophy.

Along with his helpful introduction, Morris assembled eight essays by distinguished philosophers, policy theorists, and economists to provide critical overviews of key elements of Sen’s thought. An anthology can only highlight some features of a career that spans decades and whose output includes over two dozen books and hundreds of articles and chapters. Despite the magnitude of its subject, the collection hits Morris’s target: introduce readers who are unfamiliar with some or all of Sen’s work to the range and power of his ideas. For ease of overview, I discuss the essays from the standpoint of three broad categories: social choice theory, issues in measurement and value, and themes in famine and development.

First, much of Sen’s work revolves around problems in social choice and related moral and policy issues. Social choice theory, as Sen notes in his Nobel lecture, considers how there can be reasonable claims about social judgment — especially given deep value pluralism. The problem, in short, is this: human beings are very different, yet there are times when we need to consider what people taken together prefer, need, or believe, and often we must square such assessments with individual persons’ respective entitlements. A further challenge is that sometimes we must consider what a group’s level of aggregate well-being is, how it compares to that of other groups, and how to improve it. Sen’s groundbreaking work has set much of the agenda for scholars working on such topics.

Many of this volume’s essays address themes in social choice and aggregation; the essays by Kevin Roberts and Peter Vallentyne address these issues in detail. Roberts’ contribution is a helpfully concise but demandingly technical account of Sen’s achievements in aggregating information in calculations of social choice. His chapter highlights how Sen’s informationally enriched approaches are better than alternatives at measuring well-being and giving a basis for interpersonal comparisons. This chapter may be of special interest to scholars well versed in quantitative methods from the social sciences. Peter Vallentyne’s essay addresses similar themes and may seem daunting to formalism-shy readers, but his chapter is a rewarding and clear survey of rival theories of justice, especially sufficientarianism, prioritarianism, and egalitarianism. He explores in some detail Sen’s account of aggregate poverty, its assumptions, and its limitations. His careful overview also considers what a satisfactory distribution-sensitive theory of justice must include and how it should assess improvements in human well-being.

The next broad theme in the essays concerns Sen’s work on measurement and value. As Morris highlights in the introduction, Sen rejects welfarist views, which reduce assessments of well-being to that of utility. Such views wrongly ignore freedoms, capabilities, and other significant metrics of well-being. The essay by Shatakshee Dhongde and Prasanta Pattanaik, for instance, highlights Sen’s criticisms of leading accounts of rational choice. As the authors note of Sen’s view, a proper theory of rational choices includes preferences and motives and abandons the implausible homo economicus picture of human beings. Our welfare is not purely a function of satisfying self-regarding welfare-enhancing preferences. The authors discuss how we might mistakenly rush to the rescue of rational choice theories with a more inclusive notion of self-regarding choice. This is a familiar move in some recent work among thinkers inspired by Thomas Hobbes (e.g., David Gauthier, Gregory Kavka, and perhaps Lester Hunt). Sen is deeply suspicious of such approaches. Instead, he proposes that sometimes another’s goals will displace one’s own.

Christopher Morris’s essay explores how Sen brings ethics to bear on economics, especially in light of economists’ legendary wariness of value-theoretic considerations. Sen’s 1970 Collective Choice and Social Welfare defends incorporating value claims in the social sciences. Since we have no way to show conclusively that a value judgment is “basic” — that the judgment “is supposed to apply under all conceivable circumstances” (here quoted on p. 41) — then it becomes difficult if not impossible to know whether a given judgment is basic. There may then be room for some science that includes value claims.

Moral skeptics might wonder whether morality can fulfill its categorical pretensions, and, if we cannot be sure that it does, whether we may include moral considerations in economic analyses. Sen argues on the side of inclusion, and Morris takes Sen’s remarks as a cue for exploring how and whether moral claims provide reasons. If they do not provide reasons, then perhaps as Sen suggests they might nevertheless “apply” to all agents. Such a view echoes Philippa Foot, who has defended the idea that morality need not be inescapably binding in order for it to apply to all and provide reasons to most.1 How morality might do this independently of agents’ preferences may strike some skeptical critics as mysterious. However, Morris finds such normativity perfectly sensible. His remarks here on counterpreferential choice and Sen’s account of “commitment” briefly but compellingly indicate why. (This theme also comes up in the chapters by Sabina Alkire on human development and David A. Crocker and Ingrid Robeyns on Sen’s capabilities framework.) As Morris indicates, sometimes rules constrain agents’ practical reasoning beyond what an all-things-considered account of the balance of reasons might indicate. Sometimes agents have a reason to alter or even act against their preferences so that certain options that norms forbid no longer count in the balance of reasons. This way, other persons, groups or causes with which one identifies, and moral norms, might then each be targets of commitment that give reasons that displace one’s own preferences.

Phillip Pettit’s essay explores some of the contours and implications of Sen’s view of freedom as decisive preference. Pettit notes that Sen’s view allows mediated actions to be instances of freedom. Both Sen and Pettit agree that democratic institutions sustain and amplify freedom. Pettit adds that either directly or indirectly, actively or “virtually,” citizens ensure that they are in a position to achieve their ends. Pettit here extends Sen’s multidimensional conception of freedom toward his own account of republican freedom, which he has powerfully defended elsewhere.2 Of note is Pettit’s suggestion to add “status freedom” as a component of social assessments of freedom. On this view, freedom is simply a distinctive social (and particularly political) “status” of equal inclusion and protection by those social and political institutions that sustain free choice. Thus conceived, there is nothing to maximize. Pettit sees his account as being in the spirit of Sen’s capabilities approach and potentially improving on Sen’s “option”-based notion of freedom. But it is not clear Sen would find it entirely congenial.

Sen seems to want a notion of freedom that gives us something to measure and improve. But unlike Sen’s account, Pettit’s status freedom is not a scalar notion. This might be a problem. Suppose previously disenfranchised persons were to gain some voting rights but still lack the same protected powers as other citizens to own and operate businesses, divorce, or travel. Under the status freedom account, it is unclear how this extension of the franchise would be an improvement in freedom. After all, the new voters are still unfree since they do not have the same status as others. Pettit may allow that it is an improvement in other ways, but granting the vote seems to make marginalized persons more free than they were previously. The status approach might have difficulty accommodating this.

Pettit’s republican freedom captures the idea of people equally enjoying “a standing in which they can walk tall, conscious of being equally protected against others — including the state itself — in a common domain of choice” (p. 110). When freedom is a status, it “does not wax and wane with marginal shifts in the commodities or services over which choice can be exercised” (p. 110). Though it has republican roots, Pettit’s view here is reminiscent of the role of rights in liberal social theory — at least as Joel Feinberg once described it.3 In contrast with liberal pluralism, though, saying that freedom involves choice in a “common domain” may strike some liberal critics as unduly monistic. (On Pettit’s behalf, some liberals’ defense of multiple, sometimes disparate domains of choice is not without difficulty.) Pettit’s remark that the extent of freedom does not depend on marginal shifts in availability of goods seems correct, but it leaves open the possibility that freedom’s extent might indeed improve with substantial shifts in such goods. This may invite exactly the sort of scalar notion of freedom that Pettit resists. Some readers may also wonder how republican freedom includes socially and politically protected powers to exclude. Such powers are at the heart of property rights which, as Sen suggests in his writings and as Steven Scalet and David Schmidtz defend in their contribution to the collection, may be crucial ingredients in promoting human well-being. If our notion of freedom allows and protects such powers, it may permit some inequalities that challenge the idea of completely equal republican citizenship.

Pettit concludes his account on an optimistic note about the power of democracy to protect against domination. We might agree at least in the spirit of Churchill: democracy might be the best available option given all the other lousy alternatives. But it may be unclear that democratic control is, as Pettit notes (p. 112), “no danger to freedom” — even under a republican model of freedom. Readers curious about how Pettit would address such challenges would do well to study his extensive published work on republicanism.

Certainly one of Sen’s key contributions on the theme of measurement and value is his capabilities approach. This is the focus of the chapter by David A. Crocker and Ingrid Robeyns. They discuss in crisp overview the roots of Sen’s capability framework and what role agency plays in his account. The relevant capabilities include real opportunities to pursue goals and explore alternative beings and doings. Such capabilities constitute a life’s value. (Note again Sen’s approach is richer than more monistic welfarist theories of value.) The authors highlight how Sen’s framework puts him at odds not just with many economic theories but with theories of justice such as utilitarianism and Rawlsian liberalism. They also helpfully note the significance of agency in Sen’s account (here complementing related remarks by Pettit) as a lens for understanding, selecting, and weighing various capabilities in our measures of well-being. Crocker and Robeyns amplify Sen’s views by providing both the conditions of agency and presenting agency as a scalar phenomenon. The authors close by highlighting some remaining challenges for scholars working on agency, including how to map Sen’s account on to recent work on autonomy, collective agency, and value pluralism. I might add that some ethicists’ recent skeptical work on agency as a central moral and political value4 might challenge agency’s place in an account of human well-being.

The account of agency is crucial when considering what it is about democratic institutions that, as Sen has written, prevented any famines in modern-day democracies. This brings us to the third main theme in these essays, that of famine and human development. Steven Scalet and David Schmidtz’s essay runs with Sen’s findings that famine is not mainly a supply problem. On the authors’ account, famine comes from “failed relationships among people regarding food” (p. 172) — especially regarding property norms.

Scalet and Schmidtz point to the tragedy unfolding in Zimbabwe to illustrate the danger of distortive political choices and inattention to market institutions. To be sure, as Sabina Alkire notes in her chapter, Sen does not defend any monistic approach to famine relief, and so he does not see market institutions as the only resources for preventing poverty and suffering. On Sen’s view, public action, cultural norms, and government regulations are also likely some of the ingredients in the mix needed to sustain well-being.

Drawing on related work by Hernando de Soto, Scalet and Schmidtz discuss how government bureaucracy impedes exactly the sort of creativity needed to get people the food they need. Indeed, in contrast with much recent development scholarship, hungry persons are not so ignorant and poor that only western aid can save them. As Scalet and Schmidtz note, they have the drive and the resources to feed themselves but can leverage neither to their advantage. There are tragic institutional gaps (such as the lack of credit mechanisms) and ghastly political failures that obstruct efficient property institutions. Taking a cue from Sen, the authors suggest that dealing with hunger might call for insightfully unleashing untapped social capital.

Sabina Alkire’s essay presents an overview of some of Sen’s seminal work on development. Alkire describes Sen’s multidimensional theory as emphasizing human development over growth-oriented development. Alkire highlights some of Sen’s empirical work in measuring poverty, the substantive problems (including perverse policy implications) of competing measures, and glances at the rich literature Sen’s non-welfare-based poverty measure generated. Alkire also discusses the controversy surrounding Sen’s research on “missing women.” Sen claims that tens of millions of females have somehow disappeared over the past few decades. Because of some developing countries’ social norms, these missing females are the persons who either could have been born but were not, or they were born but did not make it into adulthood. The results are unsustainable demographic imbalances in many developing countries.

Alkire discusses some of Sen’s work on population. In contrast to the repeatedly disproven predictions of professional Malthusian worriers such as Paul Ehrlich, Sen has been among scholars resisting the ideas of a “population bomb” and the draconian state-sanctioned policies to defuse it. Indeed, many societies now face exactly the opposite challenge: too few babies are born to sustain many entrenched social and economic institutions (especially the welfare state apparatus). Sen defends a decentralized noncoercive shift in norms regarding childbearing, secondary to improvements in educational and health care opportunities. Such shifts would respectfully promote sustainable population trends.

The essays in Morris’s anthology offer a clear guide to key aspects of Sen’s thought. This multidisciplinary collection should be of interest to both experts and novices. The distinguished contributors distill Sen’s position and influence in many fields. The essays are appetizers to further study of Sen’s provocative work and the literatures to which he has been such a major contributor.

1 Philippa Foot, “Morality as a System of Hypothetical Imperatives,” Philosophical Review 81 (1972): 305-315.

2 See, e.g., Phillip Pettit, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government (Oxford UP, 2000).

3 Joel Feinberg, “The Nature and Value of Rights,” Journal of Value Inquiry 4 (1970): 243-257.

4 See, e.g., Chandran Kukathas, The Liberal Archipelago (Oxford UP, 2007).