Ambiguity and the Absolute: Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty on the Question of Truth

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Frank Chouraqui, Ambiguity and the Absolute: Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty on the Question of Truth, Fordham University Press, 2014, 304pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823254118.

Reviewed by Stefan Kristensen, Université de Genève


Frank Chouraqui's book is at once both incredibly ambitious and terribly simple. It's about two philosophers, one from the end of the nineteenth century and the other from the mid-twentieth; one German, the other French; one soon excluded from the academic system, the other well integrated into it; one using literary language, the other theorizing philosophy's metaphorical language; one rooted in ancient philosophy and mythology, the other rooted in phenomenology and the philosophy of perception. One could go on like this quite long, only to discover that the latter one (Merleau-Ponty) hardly quoted the former (Nietzsche), except for a few sporadic places. The parallel reading of the two seems at first glance difficult to justify.[1] Thus the ambition of the book is at once its simplicity: show the relevance of this parallel reading in spite of the scarce traces of "influence" of the one on the other. As the author himself writes in the introduction, "if Merleau-Ponty did not totally ignore Nietzsche, it is manifest that his knowledge of him was partial and mostly indirect" (p. 6).

Chouraqui is smart, courageous or reckless enough to take up this challenge. He has without a doubt picked up the relevant problem and the right method. The problem is the question of truth, and the method is a systematic structural comparison between the ontological strategies of both thinkers. Of course, one needs a certain dose of good will to consider Nietzsche in a phenomenological perspective and Merleau-Ponty as a metaphysician. But this chiasm doesn't imply any violence to the thinking of both of them -- at least Chouraqui provides enough textual evidences to support him in his project. And indeed, the parallels are striking: first we have with Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty two attempts to contextualize, incarnate and embody truth; in other words to consider truth as the object of a certain kind of experience rather than an entity existing in and for itself. Destroy Platonism and build a philosophy of truth (of the essence of truth) on the basis on the experience of truth in life.

Chouraqui follows the same strategy for both thinkers, with the first part of his book devoted to Nietzsche and the second to Merleau-Ponty, with a transition connecting the two. Both parts are divided into three chapters, showing the similarities in the structure of the two philosophies. As he summarizes in the conclusion, chapters 1 and 4 show that both consider experience as being grounded in the preobjective realm; chapters 2 and 5 trace the respective methods of thematizing this preobjective -- Nietzsche's idea of the incorporation of truth and Merleau-Ponty's existential reduction; in chapters 3 and 6, finally, Chouraqui draws the ontological conclusions from his discussion, namely that Being is productivity, i.e., self-falsification and ongoing production of new truths to be falsified. This summary is very rough and probably not entirely understandable by itself ,  I provide it to to incite the reader to have a look at the real thing (also it would take far too long to develop in detail).

In the preface, the author makes a daring admission: "This book has many flaws" (p. xvii), but he doesn't elaborate on them, thus inciting the reader to look for them herself. I have looked quite closely, and found no clear "flaws"; the following are rather questions, or inquiries, to expand and complicate the matter. First there is a question on the overall structure of the book: in a certain sense, Chouraqui's reason for taking up the parallel reading of Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty is the latter's view that Nietzsche was the first phenomenological philosopher in the sense that he was the first to completely and rigorously abandon any idea of a 'thing-in-itself', any form of absolute pregiven transcendence, i.e., to have applied Husserl's principle of absence of prejudice. But this view of Merleau-Ponty is an interpretation, putting Nietzsche under the perspective of the phenomenological movement that was still to come. Why did Chouraqui not go backwards in history, rather than take Nietzsche as the first stage in a history? Actually the story he tells begins with Merleau-Ponty, goes back to Nietzsche and then returns to the French philosopher. In fact, the transition chapter is written in order to explain how the Merleau-Ponty investigation is in fact opened up by the ambiguities in Nietzsche's conception of ontology.

The following is a close reading of the transition chapter in order to show the author's style and argumentation, and the way he discusses the interpretations of two other unavoidable giants, Heidegger and Deleuze. The part on Nietzsche ends with a problem: put roughly, Nietzsche doesn't accept the relevance of the question of Being as such since he recognizes only the notion of becoming. More precisely, Being remains unattainable since the only way to approach it is through the eternal recurrence, so, as Chouraqui puts it, "for Nietzsche, becoming cannot lead into being and, alas, becoming is all there is" (p. 114). The transition chapter is written to situate the question of Being in Nietzsche in relation to the phenomenon of becoming, and thereby answer two objections to his reading of Nietzsche and Merleau-Ponty, one from a Deleuzian point of view and the other from a Heideggerian point of view.

The Deleuzian objection has to do with the conception of Being as fullness or as identical with becoming; Deleuze criticizes phenomenology for operating with a concept of intentionality directed towards things, which then, in Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, would concern Being as such. In form of a question, this objection would be: Is there any way to conceive of Being as full, as completely possessed by intentionality, i.e., is there any way to establish a truth concerning Being as such? The Heideggerian objection is that Nietzsche never actually overcomes the idea that Being is the whole of all beings, that is, he didn't formulate the "question of Being" as such. In other words, Nietzsche's position according to Heidegger remains metaphysical (interrogating what things are and finding that they are characterized by the will to power), and doesn't reach ontology (interrogating what it means for the things to be).

But, Chouraqui argues, Nietzsche does ask the question of ontology, since the will to power is a permanent becoming in time, through the actions of the self. As Chouraqui writes, "yes, Nietzsche refuses to do ontology in the Heideggerian sense,[2] but no, it is not because he overlooks the question of Being but because he considers this question to be irrelevant as long as Being is not achieved" (p. 119). All reality is will to power, and will to power is never without resistance, without something facing it. Being in this sense is never possessed, is not "an object of knowledge, or even of experience" (p. 121); it is identical with the movement of becoming. Therefore truth is the crucial phenomenon: our experience presents beings as true, but also as determinate, which is false since the objects of experience are indeterminate. Since Nietzsche doesn't conceive of an access to Being outside the particular beings and their will to power, there is also a difficulty concerning the primacy of Being as such over the beings.

This is precisely the paradox that opens up the space of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, according to Chouraqui. Merleau-Ponty articulates an ontological priority of Being (as the essence of beings) with a logical priority of beings (since there is no other access to Being). This articulation is what makes the question of truth also ontologically crucial and not only logically or epistemologically important. As one reads in chapter 5,

The very possibility of ontology is dependent on the link between the ontological and the ontic because ontology reaches Being only through the beings. As such, this ontology must seek Being as "infrastructure", that is to say, it must seek the general located inside the particular. (p. 182)

This approach to the philosophy of Merleau-Ponty is at once very simple and very profound. It is a structural approach that situates him in the history of Western metaphysics, able to solve the shortcoming in Nietzsche's, Heidegger's and other giants' approaches.[3]

Instead of going into further details of the author's complex argumentation, I will end with a few critical remarks: first concerning the way Chouraqui formulates the question of truth, or what Merleau-Ponty calls the "passage from perceptual sense to linguistic sense;"[4] second, his peculiar reception of the notion of flesh and its role in the formulation of an epistemology grounded in prereflective experience; third, the very thesis that Being is falsification.

First, one can be puzzled by the fact that the author leaves completely aside the question of epistemology in Merleau-Ponty.  When he formulated his project for the chair of philosophy at the Collège de France, Merleau-Ponty didn't have fundamental ontology in mind -- this came progressively through the 1950s, from the initial hints in his first lectures in 1952-53 to the last working note of The Visible and the Invisible. But the other thread is the question of epistemology itself and its particular guise in Merleau-Ponty's late thinking: how to account for the specific movement of the passage from perceptual sense to linguistic sense, which he also calls the problem of the symbolic. Under this aspect, Merleau-Ponty's thinking appears less successful, because he actually fails to account for the passage, since he keeps asking the question until his latest texts. Chouraqui does in fact mention the problem in his conclusion when he writes about the "transformation of experience into predication" (p. 222), but leaves the difficulties encountered by Merleau-Ponty aside. In a sense, the whole ontological endeavor of Merleau-Ponty relies on his failure to account for this very transformation.

 My second point concerns the notion of flesh. Flesh has multiple origins, but one of them is the idea of the contextuality of all knowledge, which Merleau-Ponty draws from the idea of productive thinking sketched out by Max Wertheimer. This root of the notion of flesh is more generally to be situated in Merleau-Ponty's reception of the Gestalt psychologists and their attempt to account for the production of knowledge. Since Chouraqui defines Being as self-falsification, he would have to account for the epistemological dimension of this definition as well. In this perspective, a question would be whether his interpretation of Merleau-Ponty's ontology provides a solution to the failure mentioned above.

My third point is more difficult; it is more the expression of a doubt than an explicit claim. By stating that Being is falsification, the author seems to conflate Being itself and its representation. This is probably justified from the Nietzschean point of view, but one can't help wondering if the term 'indeterminacy' wouldn't be more appropriate. If Being is an open-ended process towards an ever-greater precision in the characterization of beings, then why put this process under the heading of truth and falsification rather than determination and blurring? Which conceptual couple is more general here?

These remarks are meant in the spirit of openness of Chouraqui's book. They are meant to take seriously his courageous undertaking of renewing the articulation between phenomenology and ontology and metaphysics. If any first philosophy is possible in the present situation, the framework provided by Chouraqui certainly cannot be overlooked. As every genuine metaphysical attempt, is both untimely and contemporary.

[1] The first line of the Introduction goes like this: "Friedrich Nietzsche and Maurice Merleau-Ponty could hardly be more different men or, indeed, different thinkers" (p. 1).

[2] Nice anachronism, by the way.

[3] Another useful task would be a confrontation with other metaphysical thinkers in the 20th Century, such as Alfred North Whitehead or Raymond Ruyer.

[4] As he formulates it in a working note of The Visible and the Invisible dated February 1959 and entitled "Tacit Cogito and Speaking Subject."