American Philosophy before Pragmatism

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Russell B. Goodman, American Philosophy before Pragmatism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 218pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577545.

Reviewed by John Kaag, University of Massachusetts Lowell


American philosophy is often described as emerging full-fledged from the heads of William James and Charles Sanders Peirce in last decades of the nineteenth century. It is, along these lines, regarded as being coextensive with "pragmatism," a movement that supposedly deviated from the history of Western philosophy in its belief that truth should be judged on the basis of its practical consequences. American philosophy didn't exist before pragmatism and was largely, and self-consciously, divorced from a broader intellectual history. So the story goes. This story is, of course, the wrong way to think about the American philosophical tradition. In this book, Russell B. Goodman expands on his American Philosophy and the Romantic Tradition (Cambridge, 1990), which began to address this misconception.

The book is divided into six chapters that address the philosophies of Jonathan Edwards, Benjamin Franklin, the writers of The Federalist, Thomas Jefferson, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Henry David Thoreau. If a reader is interested in the intellectual backgrounds and objectives of these thinkers -- and their relationship to each other -- Goodman's book is required reading. There is much to admire about this relatively short (and therefore extremely ambitious) book: its historical detail, its ability to anticipate and foreshadow later philosophical developments, its attention to the nexus of the political and the philosophical, and a gracious manner of writing that invites the reader into a very accessible story about a strain of American thought. Goodman's choice to concentrate on a handful of thinkers in the analysis is justified, he claims, by his desire to treat "a core group of writers who continue to engage us, whose writings remain fresh a century or two after they were produced."

Goodman is clear about his methodology for the volume: he aims to address each American thinker in his trans-Atlantic context, explaining the way that he simultaneously appropriated and overcame European philosophical ideals. He is similarly transparent about the strands of thinking that run through the book. The first is the idea of "self-reliance" (the idea, appropriated from Kant's 1784 "What is Enlightenment"): that American thinkers should "dare to know." The second line of thinking Goodman terms "reception" (but it could equally be called Emersonian "Compensation") -- the belief that thinkers must understand the way that they are enmeshed in wider histories and social contexts. Finally, taking a turn to the overtly political, Goodman chooses the topic of slavery to orient and drive his discussion of the six men that dominate American Philosophy before Pragmatism. I will quickly describe what I take to be the high points of each chapter and then offer several observations about the arch of the narrative.

The opening chapter on Edwards is among Goodman's best. He articulates what has often been called Edwards' "sensible spirituality," an idealism that attempted to wed the insights from the empiricists to the philosophies of Platonism and scholasticism. This was no small philosophical trick for Edwards. His vision of American idealism ran against the growing tide of materialism, but did so in ways that would deviate from later American criticisms of materialism and determinism. Whereas many American thinkers would later object to the materialism of Hobbes on the basis that it compromises the chances for individual free will (think James), Edwards was more concerned that philosophers like Hobbes and Newton had jeopardized God's place in the universe. Goodman rightly notes that Edwards was after what Charles Taylor has called an "ontic logos: an ordering of nature and humanity that is, at the same time, an ordering of what we are to do" (48).

At the opening of his chapter on Franklin, Goodman makes a very useful distinction between Edward's theocentric idealism -- one that attempted to preserve certain traditional tenets of Christianity -- and Franklin's philosophy that tended more toward the Enlightenment. In Goodman's words: "Franklin operates in the world of mechanism, governed by the great ordering principles of Newtonian law. But the laws of physics do not tell one what to do; they are not normative; and they do not explain everything." (48) For Franklin, the universe provides the space and opportunity for human beings to operate on their own behalf, space and opportunity to realize human purposes (not just divine ones). Goodman very adequately shows how Franklin went about seizing this opportunity and occupying space. His was a more practical and political philosophy than Edwards', primarily because Franklin, following Francis Hutcheson and Adam Smith, believed individuals are to pursue human, rather than strictly heavenly, happiness (58-60). Goodman's chapter on Franklin is divided roughly along the lines of Emerson's description of this "great man." According to Emerson, "Franklin was a political economist, a natural philosopher, a moral philosopher and a statesman." Goodman takes his reader through each of these aspects of Franklin, providing a useful introduction for students (undergraduate and graduate) who might like to get a sense of the contours of his expansive thought. Especially insightful are Goodman's brief comments on Franklin's work as a natural philosopher. Here, a reader gets the sense, a valuable one to the study of later American philosophy, that Franklin understood the philosophical implications of error and surprise (64-65), two concepts that would come to underpin the epistemology and metaphysics of nineteenth century American philosophy.

Having briefly addressed Franklin's political vision for the United States, Goodman turns to a more detailed analysis of Republicanism in Chapter 3, highlighting the way that James Madison's The Federalist presents a system of representation in dialogue with the philosophy of Montesquieu's division of political power (90). Helpfully, he also puts American Republicanism in the context of broader concerns of political corruption and wealth distribution, concerns that find their origins in the classical writings of Plato and Aristotle (92-98). This section on the definition of the American "republic" sets the stage for Goodman's treatment of Jefferson in Chapter 4 (which in my estimation, might have been significantly expanded). One of the central claims is that Franklin and Jefferson successfully wrested American politics from the grips of religion. And there is something to this claim, but cultural and intellectual historians have spent no small amount of time debating this position and, on the whole, Goodman does not engage this debate in a sustained way. David Sehat's recent work, The Myth of American Religious Freedom (Oxford, 2011), would have gone a long way in fleshing out this basic point about American secularism. Goodman does, however, go into some detail concerning Jefferson's controversial position on slavery, and is admirably forthright about its racist strain (135).

The last two chapters take up the lives and writings of Emerson and Thoreau. Goodman is particularly at home writing about Emerson, and a reader can tell. Chapter 5 is philosophically broad and deep and gives a clear sense of how Emerson engaged with Neoplatonism (which is often overlooked), the Romantics (particularly Coleridge and Wordsworth), and the skepticism of Hume and Montaigne. One might have hoped that Goodman could have separated his analysis of Emerson into two longer sections, since the gestures that he makes toward Emerson's views on slavery and race at the end of the chapter are particularly interesting. Emerson was late in coming to the abolitionist cause and while Goodman addresses this fact in passing (192), much more needs to be said, especially in relationship to the abolitionist Theodore Parker.

Goodman's interest in the political dynamics surrounding slavery in the 1840s provide a very appropriate starting place for his discussion of Thoreau. For Goodman, Thoreau revives the ancient (both Western and non-Western) belief that philosophy is best understood as a way of life. Thoreau's criticism of modernity stemmed from Cynical and Stoic origins, and he came to the position that humanity's salvation was not to be found in modern civilization but a particular return to nature or wildness. This volume concludes in a brief epilogue that explains the way that the pre-pragmatism narrative fits in the development of American philosophy after 1870, particularly in the pragmatism of James, Peirce, and W.E.B Dubois. Goodman is particularly careful in his analysis of the relationship between James and Emerson, in highlighting the way that Emerson's Nature influenced the writing of James's The Varieties of Religious Experience (239).

American Philosophy before Pragmatism aims to overcome certain misconceptions about the American philosophical canon, but it leaves others firmly in place. Its ambitious title suggests that it will serve as an overview and exploration of a particular canon, but it often reads like a much narrower philosophical monograph. A similar problem might be expressed about Cheryl Misak's The American Pragmatists, a book that was published by the same series. The series editors need to be much more careful that the titles of their books actually match the content. If the book is only supposed to be 250-300 pages, then one needs to substantially narrow the scope of the title.

Goodman allows a reader to maintain the impression that American philosophy is the story of a few "great men." His narrative, on the whole, excludes the many women and people of color who contributed to the narrative of American philosophy before pragmatism. Goodman models his book after Paul Conkin's Puritans and Pragmatists: Eight Eminent American Thinkers. Not surprising, but rather disturbingly, all eight are white men. Goodman's volume draws from the insights of non-white scholars (Henry Louis Gates, for example) and is organized around the question of slavery, but there is not a single mention of Booker T. Washington and only a paragraph is devoted to Fredrick Douglas. American Transcendentalism is one of the valuable moments in the history of Western philosophy (pre-1900) when women make truly remarkable philosophical insights. While Goodman spends time discussing Madame de Stael (an important non-American thinker), for the most part, American feminism is downplayed or omitted entirely. Margaret Fuller, who set the terms for feminism in the nineteenth century, receives a passing mention in three pages. Lydia Maria Child, the first American to write a formal critique of slavery in the United States, whose fame rivaled Emerson's during the 1840s, whom William Lloyd Garrison called "the first woman of the Republic," who has been written about extensively for the last twenty years (Carolyn Karcher's excellent book being the prime example), is completely neglected. For a book that takes itself to be overtly political in orientation, the volume makes no mention of the rise of women's rights in the 1840s, no mention of Elizabeth Cady Stanton, Susan B. Anthony, or the Seneca Falls Convention.

All of this would be completely understandable if the volume was being marketed as a more specialized philosophical monograph. But it's not. This will be the "go-to" for a host of students -- both graduate and undergraduate -- who want to learn about philosophy in general in America in the early nineteenth century. This means that students will receive a particular picture of the tradition, one that might have been acceptable fifty or a hundred years ago, but is out of touch with today's philosophical culture. Granted, Goodman's work in the secondary literature on Emerson and Edwards is up-to-date, and admirably so, but that is not the point that is being made here. The number of thinkers and writers -- from the nineteenth century -- who were omitted from Goodman's book, combined with those neglected from the volume written by Misak, could, and I believe should, form the basis of a volume that should be added to Oxford's series in the history of philosophy: The Forgotten Movements of American Philosophy. In a hundred years, when scholars look back on this moment in American philosophy, I hope they will have more to remember and appreciate.