An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something from Nothing

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Louis Groarke, An Aristotelian Account of Induction: Creating Something from Nothing, McGill-Queen's UP, 2009, 467pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773535961.

Reviewed by John P. McCaskey, Stanford University



Induction remains a vexing problem. But, Louis Groarke says, we brought it on ourselves by a wrong turn made about four hundred years ago. He says we should return to a traditional, pre-Cartesian account of induction, one that owes its origin to Aristotle. In this addition to the McGill-Queen’s Studies in the History of Ideas, Groarke attempts to revive and extend Aristotle’s account of induction and to present it as a solution to that vexing problem. Groarke’s project is a welcome one. I will explore whether he succeeds after summarizing his thesis.

Aristotle says that induction (epagōgē) is a progression from particulars to a universal. But there is an ambiguity here. Does he mean proceeding from particular things (or groups of things) to a universal concept or term? Or does he mean proceeding from particular statements to a universal statement? The first is — or is somehow related to — abstraction and concept-formation. The second is a process of propositional inference. A common reading of Aristotle is that he was simply confused on the matter. In several passages, especially Posterior Analytics B 19, Aristotle seems to mean the first, but the mentions of epagōgē there are fleeting and frequently opaque. In his only in-depth treatment, Prior Analytics B 23, Aristotle is clearly referring to propositional inference and specifically a kind of syllogism. The core of Groarke’s project is a reconciliation of these two views.

Groarke’s reconciliation (chapter 3, “A ‘Deductive’ Account of Induction”) is a recognition that the propositional inference of Prior Analytics B 23 depends for its validity on the concept-formation of Posterior Analytics B 19. Aristotle’s inference is this: All observed Cs are B; all observed Cs are A; all A is the observed Cs (by conversion of the minor premise); therefore all As are B. An inductive inference has been rendered as a syllogism. But what justifies that conversion of the minor premise?

Conversion of a premise requires that the subject and predicate have the same extension. The proposition, “All triangles are equilateral, isosceles or scalene,” can be converted. What is true of equilateral, isosceles, and scalene is true of all triangles because there are no other kinds. The subject and predicate can be interchanged. The conventional reading of Prior Analytics B 23 is that in an Aristotelian induction conversion of the minor premise is justified by a complete enumeration (actual or presumed).

But, Groarke notes, there is another way to justify a conversion. He cites Paolo Biondi:

An induction can be held to have gone through all particular instances, not because it has actually enumerated every single particular instance … but because it has done so potentially by having acquired the cognition of the universal essence of the particulars being enumerated (119 in Groarke).

Groarke calls this not a "physical, but an in principle, examination of all cases" (130; here and subsequently, any italics are in the original). At some point, in a “moment of mental illumination” (202), we simply grasp the essence of the subject under investigation and realize that all instances of the kind have the observed property as an essential property. That is, we justify the conversion used in Prior Analytics B 23 by the process of abstraction described in Posterior Analytics B 19.

Groarke identifies different kinds or “levels” of induction (Chapter 4, “Five Levels of Induction”). The two most important are “induction proper” and “the inductive syllogism.” The first is the process of intuitive discernment by which we produce “abstraction of necessary concepts, definitions, essences, necessary attributes, first principles, natural facts, and moral principles” (158). The other is a rigorous process of inference, the process of turning empirical observations into a syllogism and using the syllogism to produce a universal conclusion.

The combination is central to Aristotelian science, for it provides the major premises of scientific demonstrations. Consider thunder (184, 192-3). Scientific demonstration begins with a definition, e.g., all extinguishing of lightning is thunder. This definition forms the major premise. A minor premise is added, e.g., all storm clouds extinguish lightning, or, these noises are the extinguishing of lightning. A scientific conclusion follows: all storm clouds thunder, or, these noises are thunder. But where does the major premise, the definition, come from? From an inductive syllogism which itself relies on the insight of induction proper: These noises are thunder; these noises are also an extinguishing of lightning; by an intuitive, non-discursive “flash of bare intelligence” (203) we see that the extinguishing of lightning is the very cause and essence of these noises; therefore, all extinguishing of lightning is thunder. Thus we get the major premise needed for the scientific demonstrations.

Induction proper provides us not only with scientific principles, but with moral ones as well (chapter 5, “Moral Induction”): “In the case of scientific inference, we leap from a particular case to a universal principle. In the case of morality, we leap from self-interest to selflessness” (235). What does Groarke say enables this ability? The cognitive health of the thinker — "Healthy human beings can see right and wrong" (229) — or more specifically the healthy ability to form proper inductions — "Those who lack all morality are intellectually deficient, … they are unable to induce the first principles of human behavior" (235). “They have not made the necessary leap to a higher way of viewing things” (236). Formally, these leaps are instances of forming concepts: “We hear courage praised … we develop a habit of courage and abstract the idea of it. In short, we induce the concept ‘courage’” (240). Again, induction proper is a process of abstraction, not of propositional inference.

Groarke explicates and defends inductive intuition by an appeal to Sir William Hamilton’s quantification of the predicate (chapter 6, “Complete Syllogistic”), to history (chapter 7, “A History of Intuitive Understanding”), and to parallels between inductive intuition and artistic creativity (chapter 8, “Creativity: The Art of Induction”). This last is particularly interesting. It is in this chapter that Groarke explores his book’s subtitle: creating something from nothing.

The theme here, in my words not Groarke’s, is that in human cognition, ampliation takes place at the conceptual not the propositional level. In Groarke’s words:

In the case of inductive reasoning we move from human experience to concepts. But human experience is inevitably individual, whereas concepts are universal. So induction [i.e., induction proper] involves a kind of creation from nothing (331).

The modern approach to induction, Groarke notes, with its propositional inference, Popperian skepticism, confirmation theory, Bayesian statistics, and demand that all reasoning be a methodical turning of a crank, leaves no place for the creative formation of concepts — the “sheer intelligence” (337) — that is at the root of all induction. It is the indefinite extension of words that makes inductive inference possible and valid:

Language makes knowledge possible… . The mind adds the conceptual content to particular sensible forms. This is the fundamental role of induction in Aristotle’s philosophy of mind. Using the intermediary of language, inductive reasoning devises concepts and definitions, rules of syntax and logical order, and ultimately propositions and arguments. When it comes to arguments, induction comes first; deductive, second (347).

Thus the concepts, not propositional inferences, provide the foundation for any statement’s universality.

Groarke’s final chapter has comparisons of his Aristotelian account of induction with contemporary discussions of first principles, with the recent revival of essentialism, and with questions about the nature of species in the philosophy of biology. These comparisons and Groarke’s final words draw attention to the reliance of his account on the existence of natural kinds and the mind’s ability to discern them. He writes,

The important point is that if the world is inhabited by natural kinds (and all the evidence indicates that it is), our knowledge of the properties of one instance of a natural kind can be transferred to all such instances. This is how induction works (428).

The spirit of this book is that it is time for a revolution, a radical rethinking of induction, and that the revolution should be a return to a “traditional,” Aristotelian conception of induction. As many an armed rebel has discovered, however, uncompleted revolutions can be very frustrating.

The insistence that we look to the ampliation of abstraction to ground the ampliation of inductive, propositional inference is a welcome call to arms, as is the advice that we look to Aristotle for guidance on how to do this. Groarke is surely right that Aristotle believed the cognitive hierarchy he described in Posterior Analytics B 19 is central to, and not antithetical to, validating the syllogism described in Prior Analytics B 23. But did Aristotle really believe induction ultimately relies on what Groarke calls “a stroke or leap of understanding,” “immediate illumination,” “moment of immediate cognition,” “a direct insight,” “moment of illumination,” and so on?

Groarke tells us that this “mental illumination” is not the same as the Platonic recollection of an innate idea or “a matter of mere feeling” (9). It is, he insists, a “properly epistemological mechanism” (9). But all that Groarke presents in the book notwithstanding, it remains difficult to see how this “direct insight” can be relied upon to provide the certain knowledge that he assures us it does. It is very helpful for two opponents arguing over the morality of abortion to be told that the applicable moral principle comes down to the definition of life, but quite unhelpful to say that one of the debaters will in a “moment of immediate illumination” see the correct definition and the other simply does “not experience the push” (250) of nature forcing itself on the mind. A scientist seeking a cure for AIDS is well advised to determine the causal essence that makes a particular disease AIDS, but what does that mean he or she should do with all the collected experimental data?

Unfortunately, Groarke overlooks three masses of material in Aristotle, or cited by Aristotle, that could help here. The first is the Topics. The term epagōgē appears in that work much more than in any of Aristotle’s others. Book V, in particular, explains how to identify essential and identifying characteristics of a class. The second source is Aristotle’s biological works. Here we get to see Aristotle as a practicing inductive scientist whose propositional conclusions are based on conceptually identifying what makes something a member of a named class. The third mass of material is one Aristotle incorporates by reference. He says that Socrates gets credit for introducing induction, and all indications in Aristotle’s corpus are that he believed his induction was the same as Socratic induction. And Socratic induction is that iterative process Socrates used to bound a concept. All of these materials indicate Aristotle believed a properly formed concept was reached not in a flash of enlightenment but by a careful, methodical, incremental, and iterative process.

Throughout antiquity, until the influence of the Neoplatonic Alexandrian commentators, epagōgē and then inductio were as closely associated with Socrates as induction nowadays is with Hume. After the work of those commentators, Prior Analytics B 23 came to be the authoritative text, and induction came to be thought of as a kind of deduction made valid by complete enumeration. This was canonical in both the Latin and Arabic traditions all the way to the sixteenth century. The canon was challenged when humanists rediscovered the Topics, Cicero, and Socrates. Aristotle had said (as Groarke notes, 7) that what sort of thing induction is, is obvious. But, in comments published in 1542, Agostino Nifo observed that a great debate had arisen about what induction is. On one side was Scholastic propositional inference; on the other the Socratic search for essence and definitions.

Groarke has indeed returned us to a moment before Descartes. He has returned us to the late sixteenth century. What Groarke calls “inductive syllogism” was then called (following Averroës) “demonstrative induction.” Traditional Aristotelians such as Jacopo Zabarella at Padua and young mystical ones such as Everard Digby at Cambridge agreed that the syllogism is made valid by conversion of the minor premise and the conversion justified by some cognitive insight. Zabarella said the insight came from turning the matter over in one’s mind, Digby from a divinely inspired realization of God’s causal efficacy in populating the world with natural classes of things. The debate ended when a new humanist Aristotelianism — with its attention on Aristotle’s biology, his Topics and Rhetoric, and the Posterior rather than Prior Analytics — found its fruition in the work of natural philosophers such as William Harvey and Robert Boyle. Then, the second book of Francis Bacon’s Novum Organum took over the task served in antiquity by book V of the Topics, the task of showing how to carefully and incrementally identify the essence of a kind.

Whether Baconian induction, Harvey’s “rule of Socrates,” or Aristotle’s own theory of scientific abstraction really can provide a sound epistemological base for objective concept-formation and then inductive propositional inference, at least all offer more promising leads than grounding inductive certainty in a “creative moment of illumination” experienced by “healthy minds.” Some normative theory of concept-formation and a full explanation for how a good concept can yield a true proposition — that is, how conceptual ampliation begets propositional ampliation - will be necessary to complete the revolution Groarke wants.

While this volume does not finish the revolution, its call to arms is a welcome one. As Groarke says, Aristotelian induction has been long misunderstood and the loss is ours. Induction does indeed remain a problem and current attempts to solve it really are continuations down a path entered centuries ago. Maybe Groarke is right that it is time to take a very big step backwards and consider a different path. His grounding of inductive skepticism in lingering Cartesian doubt deserves serious study. What he says about the similarity between artistic and scientific creativity, between art and language deserves attention, elaboration, and exploration. And how he says all this must be commended. Any philosopher who can write a treatise with so many five, four-, and even three-word sentences deserves admiration and emulation.

Overall, what Groarke says here is provocative and inviting, even if not definitive. We may hope that he and his readers continue to explore the possibility that Aristotle may have important things to offer in helping us rethink that vexing problem that is induction.


Biondi, Paolo, 2004, Aristotle: Posterior Analytics II.19. St. Foy, PQ: Laval UP.