An Introduction to Chinese Philosophy: from Ancient Philosophy to Chinese Buddhism

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JeeLoo Liu, An Introduction to Chinese Philosophy: from Ancient Philosophy to Chinese Buddhism, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 434pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405129506.

Reviewed by Shirong Luo, Mount Holyoke College


JeeLoo Liu has written a highly sophisticated introduction to Chinese philosophy that not only introduces its basic concepts, themes, and issues, but also examines and dissects them utilizing the microscope and scalpel of contemporary analytic philosophy. This kind of work is long overdue. By meticulously analyzing and lucidly presenting the primary texts of and the most up-to-date scholarship on seven ancient Chinese philosophers and four influential schools of Chinese Buddhism, Liu makes a substantial contribution to the study of Chinese philosophy.

While Liu's book is strong in terms of analysis, argumentation, and recent scholarship, it is less than comprehensive, for it only covers classical (pre-Qin) Chinese philosophy and early Chinese Buddhism. Neo-Confucianism, which constitutes a major part of Chinese thought, is not covered. Such exclusion may be disappointing to those readers who are interested in studying Chinese philosophy in a systematic way. Nevertheless, Liu acknowledges the omission and cautions the reader not to think that Chinese philosophy has only the two important periods covered in this volume. She explains the restricted scope of her book as "a result of pragmatic consideration of the length of this book"(x).

Overall, the book is well structured. The introduction sketches in broad strokes some general characteristics of Chinese philosophy. Part I focuses on ancient Chinese philosophy. It includes eight chapters discussing the Yijing (Book of Changes) and seven major philosophers of the pre-Qin period. Part II focuses on four major schools of Chinese Buddhism, with one chapter devoted to each school. All the chapters have the following sequential structure: (1) an opening section that provides a succinct introduction to a school of Chinese thought or the life and work(s) of a philosopher, (2) a number of sections in which the basic concepts, theses, and concerns of the philosopher in question are presented, interpreted, and analyzed, (3) a conclusion, (4) questions for further discussion, (5) a list of primary texts, and (6) a list of further readings.

In the first section of her book, "What is Chinese Philosophy?," Liu gives an overview of the Chinese tradition. One might expect a straightforward answer to this opening question. However, Liu is reluctant to give a fixed definition of Chinese philosophy; she thinks that "no definition of any philosophical development can ever be given, since philosophy itself is an organic body that defies definition" (p.1). Instead, she sketches some general characteristics of Chinese philosophy that every student of the subject should know. These characteristics may be summarized as follows: in comparison with Western philosophy, Chinese philosophy has a different religious foundation, which takes the form of Nature worship with an emphasis on a spiritual correspondence between the world of Nature and the world of human beings (Tian ren he yi, "Heaven and humans are harmonized into one"); Chinese philosophy has a different set of cosmological concepts (Dao, Qi, Yin, and Yang) and a strong humanistic tendency; that is to say, ancient Chinese philosophers concerned themselves primarily with social and political problems. The problem of rulership was at the center of ancient Chinese thought because the so-called "Hundred Schools" of Chinese philosophy emerged initially as a response to the needs of various rulers who were vying for supremacy. Even Daoists who advocated escapism tried to offer advice to rulers about the best way to manage a state. For example, in the Daodejing, Laozi likened ruling a large state to cooking a small fish.

Unlike other popular introductions to Chinese philosophy such as Feng Youlan's A Short History of Chinese Philosophy, Chinese Thought from Confucius to Mao Tse Tung by H. G. Creel, or Readings in Classical Chinese Philosophy edited by Philip J. Ivanhoe and Bryan W. Van Norden, Liu begins her discussion of ancient Chinese Philosophy with the Yijing. According to Liu, this arrangement is warranted because the Yijing (Book of Changes) is the source of Chinese cosmology as well as the very foundation of the whole of Chinese culture (p. 26). Strictly speaking, however, the book that is often referred to as the Yijing in the West is standardly called the Zhouyi by Chinese scholars. It contains two parts: Yijing (the core text) and Yizhuan (interpretations and commentaries). While Liu's claim about the relationship between the Zhouyi and Chinese philosophy is largely justified, it should be made clear that Confucius and his disciples were not just influenced and inspired by the basic ideas of the core text, i.e. Yijing, they may also have made great contributions to its development by interpreting and commenting on the core text, resulting thereby in Yizhuan.

Confucius' moral philosophy was characterized by one of his disciples as having a unifying thread consisting of two concepts: zhong and shu. In chapter one, Liu opens her discussion of Confucianism, with these two notions. Zhong literally means "loyalty." Shu has been variously translated as "reciprocity," "sympathetic understanding," "altruism," etc. Liu gives a different translation: "empathy" (p. 48), which I think aptly captures the meaning of shu. I am, however, a bit disappointed that she does not give any reason why she prefers "empathy" to other translations. In any event, Liu insists that Confucius' notions of zhong and shu must be understood in relation to his conception of a "moral structure" within which individuals are not all equal in relation to one another (48). Moral cultivation is another major Confucian theme. Liu claims that in Confucian society, people are classified according to their varying degrees of moral perfection as junzi (the superior person), men of ren (men of humanity), or sheng (sages). But we have reason to believe that in the Analects the terms junzi and "men of ren" often are used interchangeably rather than as different designators for people of different moral status.

In chapters two and three, Liu's trenchant analysis turns to Confucius' two great successors: Mengzi (Mencius) and Xunzi (Hsün Tzu). The fact that these two thinkers were in the same philosophical camp (Rujia, Confucianism) did not prevent them from sharply disagreeing with each other over the issue of human nature. So naturally Liu focuses on their opposing conceptions of human nature. Mencius maintains that human nature is good while Xunzi holds precisely the opposite view. Throughout her book, Liu routinely presents a philosopher's views in explicit arguments consisting of a number of premises and a conclusion. Liu represents one of Mencius' arguments for the goodness of human nature in the following argument:

1. Anyone who sees a young child about to fall into a deep well is bound to feel anxiety and commiseration in the heart… .

4. Therefore, humans have the beginning of humanity in their nature (p.73).

Liu goes on to defend Mencius by saying:

With this kind of argument, one could perhaps challenge the first premise: not everyone would naturally commiserate in the given scenario. But Mencius is not making any universal claim on human response; rather, he is making a general claim … (p. 74)

I remain unconvinced by this claim since obviously the first premise is a universal claim. There are alternative ways to defend Mencius' claim. For example, if the objection arose that "some, such as the notorious "Milwaukee Monster" Jeffrey Dahmer, would not feel anxiety and commiseration in the heart if they saw a child about to fall into a deep well," one might respond that those people had lost their humanity, and consequently they should no longer be deemed human. We have reason to believe that for Mencius, not everyone who looks, walks, and talks like a bipedal primate mammal is a human. The word "human" should be understood in the moral rather than biological or anthropomorphical sense. It is one's moral character (or one's heart) rather than one's physical appearance that determines one's humanity.

Mozi, the philosopher considered in chaper four, was commonly regarded as a fierce critic of Confucianism. He was a very interesting figure among ancient Chinese philosophers in that he "seemed to be the most religious" and also the most analytical. Mozi is standardly labeled as a utilitarian, but his version of utilitarianism predates John Stuart Mill's by more than two thousand years. As I mentioned earlier, Liu's methodology of presentation is first to quote a philosopher, then to try to analyze and present what he says in an explicit argument to facilitate assessment and evaluation. In most cases her presentations are crystal clear and effective. But occasionally one sees a premise that cannot be found in the quotation. A case in point is on pages 110 and 111.

In chapter four, Liu's discussion of Mohism starts with Mozi's idea of jian ai (which has been variously rendered in English as "universal love," "impartial concern," or "inclusive caring"). "The hallmark thesis of Mozi is his teaching of universal love, as a direct challenge to the Confucian teaching of love with distinctions" (110). What is universal love? On the surface, it means "loving everyone, family members and strangers alike, equally" (p.110). Liu argues that (the notion of) universal love is more demanding than impartiality because the latter is a demand on our rational moral judgment while the former requires not just a behavioral reformation but a radical transformation of our self-centered psychology. It seems to me that Mozi's idea of universal love is not as radical as many commentators (including Liu) have taken it to be, for if we examine the concrete behavioral changes his doctrine of universal love requires, we will notice that it is not particularly demanding. What it practically entails is a cessation of inflicting harm on others. At the time Mozi wrote the treatise on universal love he had witnessed what he called "the greatest harm to the world": "Great states attacking small ones, great families overthrowing small ones…" (p. 110). It was this "greatest harm" that he wanted to eliminate by advocating universal love. How to eliminate the greatest harm in the world? It is quite simple: "Regard others' countries as if they were my own country. Regard others' bodies as if they were my own body." That seems to be the actual meaning of Mozi's universal love. The difficulty is not to regard others' countries as if they were my own country. Rather, it is to do what this supposition entails.

The principal disagreement between Mohism and Confucianism, universal love vs. love with distinctions, has often been overstated. As a matter of fact, their positions are not so far apart. To be sure, Confucianism is noted for advocating love with distinctions, with filial piety (xiao) serving as the most important exemplification of this view. Mozi, however, never questioned the ethical significance of filial piety. On the contrary, he took his notion of universal love to be a means for fulfilling filial piety, as evidenced by Mozi's example of a filial son on pages 113 and 114 of Liu's book. I agree with Liu that "what Mozi promotes is a paradoxical assertion that the best way to promote our self-interest is to not promote our self-interest" (p. 115). But Liu does not seem to realize that seen in this light, Confucianism and Mohism appear to be complementary rather than diametrically opposed to each other. Another fundamental assumption Mozi and Confucians share is the principle of reciprocity, which states that kindness (or unkindness) should be returned. For Confucius, those who did not want to observe the ritual of three-year mourning for their deceased parents were morally depraved (bu ren). Why? Because they did not want to return (not even in a symbolic fashion) what they owed to their parents: the tender loving care given to them when they were infants. Their behavior, in the final analysis, is an infraction of reciprocity. The principle of reciprocity also underlies Mozi's ethical thinking. In Liu's discussion of the debate about the ultimate nature of Mozi's ethical theory, two opposing interpretations are presented. One portrays Mozi as holding a version of "deontological Divine Command theory," whereas the other takes him to be a "rule-utilitarian" (pp. 116-117). In the end Liu sides with the view that ultimately "Mozi is a utilitarian through and through" (p. 119). What these commentators seem to have overlooked is that Mozi appeals to the principle of reciprocity in his religious as well as utilitarian justification for universal love. According to Mozi, we should obey the will of Heaven because we are the beneficiaries of Heaven's boundless beneficence. We should show kindness to a neighbor because we want to be treated likewise. His religious justification seems to be complementary to his utilitarian justification as in cases in which, if a beneficiary cannot repay a kindness done to him, we still should do good since we owe a debt of gratitude to Heaven; mutual benefiting is the will of Heaven. In addition, in cases in which a perfect crime is committed, Heaven will redress the injustice. I have argued that the gap between Mohism and Confucianism is not so wide as many take it to be. But there is no denying that Mozi underestimated the transforming power of music, poetry, and ritual in shaping one's character; he paid little attention to the subtlety and complexity of self-cultivation and moral psychology. Clearly, in those areas, Confucianism has much more to offer.

Liu's treatment of Daoism, Zhuangzi's views in particular, is more thorough and detailed than those of other schools of ancient Chinese philosophy. It is perhaps because Daoism has been more extensively compared with Western analytic thinking with regard to the areas of metaphysics, philosophy of language, epistemology, and ethics. However, readers who do not have prior training in Western (analytic) philosophy may feel a bit overwhelmed by her extensive use of jargon such as "language skepticism," "methodological skepticism," "asymmetrical relativism," etc. On the other hand, Liu's thorough analyses and lucid presentations of different interpretations by contemporary commentators will be attractive and valuable to those who have had some basic training in both Western and Chinese philosophy, and who would like to take a "shortcut" to the front lines of contemporary scholarship.

In Part II of her book, Liu discusses four (major) schools of Chinese Buddhism: the Consciousness-only (Wei-shi) School, the Hua-yan School, the Tian-tai School, and the Chan (Zen) School. Liu not only introduces their basic concepts and doctrines, she also compares them and traces their development through time in order to establish the thesis that Chinese Buddhism gradually steered away from the anti-realist thinking of Indian Buddhism. The author claims that this section constitutes "the most groundbreaking part of the entire book, since no one has ever given these Chinese Buddhist schools any clear and comprehensive analysis before" (xi). I take her claim to mean that no one in the English-speaking world has given them any clear and comprehensive analysis before, for there have been books written in Chinese providing a comprehensive discussion of the same subject matter, i.e. Chinese Buddhism, albeit using different approaches. A recent example is Xinbian Zhongguo Zhexue Shi (A New History of Chinese Philosophy) by Feng Dawen and Guo Qiyong, Beijing: Renmin Chuban She, 2004.

In spite of the minor criticisms mentioned above, I found Liu's Introduction to Chinese Philosophy to be a serious and commendable effort at examining ancient Chinese philosophy and Chinese Buddhism through the lens of contemporary analytic philosophy. By making extensive reference to a broad range of commentators, she presents the most up-to-date scholarship and cutting-edge research in Chinese and comparative philosophy. This book will undoubtedly make classical Chinese thought more relevant to contemporary philosophical discourse and more accessible to analytically-minded readers.