An Introduction to Decision Theory

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Martin Peterson, An Introduction to Decision Theory, Cambridge UP, 2009, 317 pp., $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521716543.

Reviewed by Ben Eggleston, University of Kansas



Decision theory is commonly understood to comprise three largely separable topics: individual decision-making (where the theory of maximizing expected utility is the dominant paradigm), game theory (with its characteristic concern with scenarios such as the prisoner’s dilemma and solution concepts such as equilibrium strategies), and social-choice theory (featuring results such as Arrow’s impossibility theorem). For courses covering these topics, the textbook options have been lacking. Seminal works — such as von Neumann and Morgenstern’s Theory of Games and Economic Behavior (1944 and 1947), Savage’s The Foundations of Statistics (1954), and Luce and Raiffa’s Games and Decisions (1957) — are dated and idiosyncratic in presentation, not to mention unsuitable for many courses. Jeffrey’s The Logic of Decision (1965 and 1983) is innovative, but is thereby also nonstandard in some of its conceptual apparatus, and it omits coverage of game theory and social-choice theory. Michael Resnik’s Choices: An Introduction to Decision Theory (1987) covers all three of the main topics of decision theory, but is compromised by a frustratingly large number of textual errors and expository lacunae. Finally, Michael Allingham’s Choice Theory: A Very Short Introduction (2002) is engaging and informative, but is too short to be the primary text for a normal semester-long course. Aware of these helpful but limited works, many instructors of such courses have long wished for a more appealing option.

Particularly against this background, but also on its own merits, Martin Peterson’s An Introduction to Decision Theory (2009) is a welcome addition to the field. Having published extensively on decision theory and related topics, Peterson is an ideal author for such a book. Moreover, he complements his technical expertise with broad philosophical perspective, frequently commenting on the philosophical meanings, bases, and objections that are pertinent to the various models and principles of decision theory. Philosophers should be pleased to see an introduction to decision theory that has this sort of philosophical orientation and sophistication.

At about 300 pages, this book is of a length appropriate for most philosophy courses. About three-fourths of it is devoted to individual decision-making, including the following topics: decisions under ignorance versus decisions under risk, the mathematics of probability and various philosophical interpretations of probability, the von Neumann-Morgenstern theorem and the axioms (i.e., the rationality conditions on preferences) on which it is based, challenges to this framework such as the Allais paradox and the Ellsberg paradox, causal versus evidential decision theory (motivated by Newcomb’s problem), Bayesian versus non-Bayesian decision theory, and descriptive decision theory (drawing on the work of Kahneman and Tversky). Particularly strong in these chapters are Peterson’s brief history of decision theory, his account of the motivations for the various competing rules for decisions under uncertainty, his chapters on probability (especially his extremely clear account of the Monty Hall problem), and his distinction among different kinds of risk aversion (e.g., aversion to risky outcomes when guaranteed outcomes are available, as in the Allais paradox, versus aversion to unknown probabilities when known probabilities are available, as in the Ellsberg paradox). Some instructors might wish, however, for more extensive coverage of expected-utility theory itself, including more explanation of the concept of a weighted average, more practice for students in the computation of expected utilities, more discussion of the meanings and standard defenses of the rationality conditions on preferences (especially the continuity condition), and more discussion of the diminishing marginal utility of money. Still, Peterson does note the important point that the diminishing marginal utility of money does not violate the conditions on preferences from which the von Neumann-Morgenstern expected-utility theorem can be derived, and overall, Peterson’s coverage of individual decision-making is both thorough and balanced.

Game theory occupies about a sixth of the book, with the principal topics being zero-sum games, the prisoner’s dilemma, Nash equilibrium strategy sets, and the Nash solution to bargaining problems. Peterson also provides some helpful sections on the influence of game theory on evolutionary theory and ethical theory. Again, some instructors might wish for more emphasis of certain points, such as the crucial fact that in a zero-sum game with no pure-strategy equilibria, the mixed-strategy equilibrium results from each player’s adopting a strategy that makes his opponent indifferent among all of her strategies, both pure and mixed alike. But this is a matter of emphasis, not any omission on Peterson’s part, and many instructors may share Peterson’s judgments of how space is best allocated in these chapters of the book.

The remainder of the book is concerned with social-choice theory. At just about a twelfth of the book’s length, this portion of the book is too short to permit in-depth consideration of any topics. But the topics included are arguably the most important ones in this area: Arrow’s impossibility theorem, Sen’s theorem concerning the impossibility of a Paretian liberal, and Harsanyi’s derivation of utilitarianism.

Beyond these considerations of overall organization and topical coverage, the book is characterized, as mentioned earlier, by a technical and philosophical sophistication that enhances every page. At the same time, though, some aspects of the book may limit its usefulness in the classroom. First, the book presupposes a high level of technical sophistication on the part of the reader. For example, when deriving one mathematical expression from another, Peterson frequently skips important steps, and it is likely that some students will get stuck. Similarly, in proving important propositions such as theorems, Peterson frequently leaves important claims unstated. In many cases, filling in the gaps will require more insight and persistence than many students have; in some cases, they may require more than many instructors have. It should be noted that even the elliptically presented derivations and arguments are generally elegant, and many of the most difficult proofs are marked with special boxes to indicate their difficulty level. But while these boxes may decrease readers’ surprise at being unable to follow the material so marked, they obviously cannot increase readers’ comprehension of that material. Instructors intending to use this book in courses, then, will need to be thoughtful regarding which difficult passages (boxed and otherwise) to give their students further explanations of, and which to advise their students not to worry about.

A second factor that may limit this book’s usefulness in courses is that there are a significant number of errors in the text. Some are so obvious as to be harmless — e.g, writing ‘0’ instead of ‘u(0)’, writing ‘75’ instead of ‘0.75’, and leaving off the first character of ‘p(A|B)’ in a context where the full expression is clearly intended. But there are other errors, of which I counted about thirty, that are quite likely to confuse many students. Some of these are just a matter of a few characters, or even just one character — e.g., an incorrect number, or a minus sign where there should be a plus sign. But of course, in mathematical and logical contexts, even such brief errors can be substantive and, to novices, confusing. It should be noted that probably no individual student will be confused by all of the potentially confusing errors I just mentioned. Some of them take considerably more expertise than others to notice, so that many students green enough to be confused by some of the more basic errors will overlook the more subtle ones, while any student skilled enough to notice the more subtle ones will also probably be confident enough in his or her understanding to be unaffected by the more basic ones. But, like the technically difficult passages mentioned above, the potentially confusing errors will require instructors to give some additional thought to the question of what sort of guidance they want to provide for their students as they work through this text.

Despite these impediments to using it as the primary textbook in a course, this book is a valuable addition to the field. Philosophers looking for a substantial introduction to decision theory should read this book in preference to any other, and so should mathematicians, economists, and other readers who have some technical facility but who would benefit from a philosophically oriented survey of the subject. Moreover, this book should be at the top of any instructor’s list of books to read in preparation for teaching a course on decision theory. Finally, despite the matters mentioned above, this is the most useful textbook for instructors to adopt for such courses. Practically every book requires supplementation by instructors, after all; the textbook that “teaches itself” is probably an unattainable (if long-held) vision. Overall, this book offers a substantial, wide-ranging, and philosophically and technically sophisticated introduction to decision theory. It is the best book of its kind.