An Introduction to Ethics

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John Deigh, An Introduction to Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 241pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521775977.

Reviewed by Nancy E. Schauber, University of Richmond


Having served for a number of years as the editor of Ethics, John Deigh is especially well-qualified to write an introduction to the subject that is not only comprehensive but that also reflects the current state of play in the field. The result of his efforts is a tightly integrated and exceptionally well-written survey of the central questions of ethics.

An introductory ethics text may serve at least two purposes. First, it may be adopted in an undergraduate course introducing students to theoretical ethics. While there are certain hazards in adopting any such text as a stand-alone resource for such a course, Deigh's Introduction to Ethics would be an outstanding choice, at least partly because the aim of this book is not just to introduce students to the problems and the positions of moral philosophers, but also to do moral philosophy. Second, an introduction to ethics might be thought to be useful to non-specialists who would like to gain some basic familiarity with the subject matter. There is also a third possible audience, rarely mentioned (since they don't use introductory texts), namely graduate students in philosophy. I recommend Deigh's book to those wanting a sophisticated introduction for undergraduates, to non-specialists prepared to engage with a serious text, and to every graduate student in philosophy.

This book is a fair-minded examination of the central questions of ethics, a study of theories of right and wrong found in the great ethical works of Western philosophy. Its chapters cover egoism, the eudaimonism of Plato and Aristotle, act and rule utilitarianism, modern natural law theory, Kant's moral theory, and existentialist ethics. One unusual and welcome feature of this book is its final chapter on practical reason, which includes some discussion of metaethics and moral psychology.

The author motivates the Introduction in a couple of different and useful ways. First, Deigh points out to newcomers that the questions of ethics "resist easy answers, not because of the difficulties of getting the relevant facts, but because of difficulties in making sense of them and how they bear on these questions." (p. 1) In other words, philosophical ethics begins with seemingly simple questions that, after scrutiny, turn out to be far more complex. A case in point is the example with which Deigh begins and which recurs throughout the text, namely what to do upon finding a wallet stuffed with a wad of cash. After quickly canvassing a few alternative responses, Deigh concludes that the question we are asking concerns "what you have good reason to do in circumstances where dishonest action is safe from detection and apparently more profitable than honest action" (p. 3). The other example that receives repeated attention is Glaucon and Adeimantus' restatement of Thrasymachus' challenge to Socrates. As Deigh understands it, this is one of the main problems of ethics, namely, "on what basis, if any, can we understand justice as admirable in itself, as something one has good reason to practice even in circumstances in which one would profit from injustice without the least fear of being found out" (p. 6-7). The concern that guides the subsequent discussions of psychological and ethical theories is what we have reason to do. The challenge for ethical theory is to find the rational grounds for the authority of basic conventional standards like justice and honesty.

The overarching organizing principle of this book is the broad distinction between teleological and deontological ethical theories. Teleological theories locate the authority of moral standards of right and wrong in practical thought with reference to the ends or interests served by the conduct that is guided by these standards. Deontological theories, by contrast, criticize teleological theories for locating morality's authority in our goals and interests; such theories think that the correct standards of right and wrong conduct are independent of the ends and interests of those whose conduct they guide. Teleological conceptions of ethics require a study of what are good and bad ends in order to determine right and wrong conduct, while such deontological conceptions of ethics do not require such knowledge to determine right and wrong conduct. Deigh begins with an examination of teleological theories, then taking up those that are deontological. Following this discussion he takes up a skeptical challenge posed by existentialists, a challenge that suggests important questions concerning practical reason and ethical knowledge.

Deigh presents each of the theories he considers as a coherent and comprehensive ethical theory, and he explores them in their richness and complexity. Each theory is critically examined and presented as an attempt to surmount some of the deficiencies of its predecessor. Through this critical process the book moves towards some concluding suggestions about the direction in which we must look for an acceptable ethical theory.

Deigh begins with egoism, which Deigh takes to be, at least at first blush, the most intuitively appealing of ethical theories. Deigh carefully distinguishes different understandings of "happiness" noting that we sometimes speak of happiness when referring to a short-lived feeling of joy but also to denote a "condition of a person's life as a whole or at least a significant stretch of it." (p. 28) Philosophical ethics is interested in the latter sense. Another recurrent theme concerns how we are to understand human well-being. Hedonism takes human well-being to consist in pleasure and the absence of pain, while perfectionism takes human well-being "to consist in activity that is both worth doing and is excellently done" (p. 29). Having made these distinctions, Deigh recounts the primary arguments for egoism, psychological egoism, and psychological hedonism. Deigh argues persuasively that Hobbes' program of defending egoism is ultimately unsuccessful because Hobbes is unable to meet Thrasymachus' challenge. Deigh concludes that arguments for egoism are doomed unless they can acknowledge the fundamental diversity of human motives. It is not just that Hobbes cannot successfully rebut the free-rider. It is rather that he cannot begin to address Plato's primary concern, namely, that right action be shown to be inseparable in conception from the highest good. It is this which leads to the rejection of hedonism.

Having rejected hedonism, the perfectionist prong of the distinction between conceptions of happiness remains to be considered. In connection with Plato and Aristotle's eudaimonism, Deigh introduces another theme central to ethical theory, namely the opposition of rationalism to naturalism. Deigh rehearses the familiar objections to the treatment of justice in the Republic, namely that attributing justice to the well-ordered soul does not speak to the question of how a just person treats others. Justice as a personal virtue doesn't yield an answer to the question posed earlier, namely, what one has reason to do upon finding a wallet stuffed with cash. Aristotle's naturalist attempt to defend the perfectionist program by reference to our human nature is, in Deigh's judgment, also unsuccessful because tying human well-being to the performance of our function is bound to fail. While Deigh thinks that there is real insight to the eudaimonistic idea that the best life for human beings is complete and fulfilling by virtue of the realization of our special powers and capabilities, the theory falls short of demonstrating that the virtue of justice is necessary in all cases to living a good human life.

Since moral theories focused on self-concern cannot demonstrate the need for justice in a life well-lived, modern theories take up a different moral outlook, holding that ethical considerations tend to stem either from a deontological perspective, according to which we have a special rational capacity for knowing our duty, or a consequentialist perspective, according to which the good of human kind (or perhaps all sentient beings) is the highest good. The chapter on utilitarianism provides clear discussions of direct and indirect utilitarianism as well as motive utilitarianism, offering the more-or-less standard criticisms of these theories. Perhaps the most interesting feature of this chapter is where it engages the main theme of the book, namely, what it is reasonable for us to do. Deigh points out that "it is possible that sometimes the most reliable performers of right action can act rightly only if they act contrary to their principles, and it would not be reasonable for someone to go against his principles if the values those principles reflected were sound" (p. 121). Since this is precisely what utilitarianism may require of us, it severs right action from reasonable action. The result is to put utilitarianism out of business as an ethical theory.

The dialectical character of Deigh's book is especially evident in the chapter on the moral law. Beginning with the contrast between teleological and deontological ethical theories, Deigh shows the reader how problems with the first sort of deontological theory, Divine Command theory, suggest the plausibility of rational intuitionism. The insights of rational intuitionism -- namely, the commonsensical nature of moral knowledge -- combined with fundamental objections -- namely, that it holds moral truths to be self-evident -- leads to Kant's conception of practical reason. For an introductory text, Deigh's discussion of Kant on maxims and the Categorical Imperative is relatively sophisticated even while it attempts to capture the intuitive appeal of the law-based theory. I have a minor quibble here about Deigh's explanation of the Categorical Imperative. Maxims may fail to meet the CI test in one of two ways: they may be incoherent or they may be inconsistent. Deigh's discussion of this point would be improved if he had included just a brief explanation of the different between incoherence and inconsistency. It is often difficult for first time readers to understand the different ways in which Kant thinks certain maxims fail the test; a brief discussion of this would be welcome. The chapter on the moral law concludes with an instructive discussion of formalism in ethics and how Kant's theory may be vulnerable to such charges. Deigh shows in a way that is both intuitive and clear that only those who believe that the heart of morality is specifically lawfulness will not be driven to the conclusion that Kant's ethical theory is excessively formalistic.

Confronting the charges of excessive formalism, Deigh considers what reasons rational agents might have for acting lawfully. To address the question of what role lawfulness plays in our thinking about possibilities for self-determination, Deigh provides a concise but useful account of Kant's various formulations of the Categorical Imperative. According to Kantians, the value one realizes by acting lawfully is that of autonomy. (p. 171) The authority of morality resides in one's obeying one's own freely made decisions about how to act; this is a form of self-determination. While Deigh does not reject Kant's notion of individual self-determination, he acknowledges that the autonomy of the will is not the only notion of self-determination. Existentialist philosophers since Kant focus on power and choice, but unlike Kant they do not emphasize the powers of reason in characterizing what is distinctive in human thought.

Deigh's quick discussion of existentialism is perhaps the least satisfying section of his book. While he provides the reader with a basic overview of the terrain, it is not written with either the clarity or incisiveness that characterizes the rest of this Introduction. For instance -- though this is a minor point -- Deigh appears to conceive the central concern of existentialist ethics as "what sort of person to be" (p. 182). This formulation sounds perilously close to the way virtue ethicists frame the central question of ethics, namely, "what sort of person should one be." But surely these two ethical views are vastly different, and Deigh gives us no reason to think that existentialists should hold that we should be any sort of person at all, that is, a being unified by embracing either virtues or rational principles. This is a small point; existentialist ethics probably does not admit of as crisp a formulation as the other theories under consideration, and its inclusion in the text is welcome.

The existentialist doctrine of radical choice throws into question the presumed authority of the standards of morality that have been the subject of the rest of this text; this doctrine motivates the final chapter on practical reason -- the most distinctive chapter in this book. Here we are presented with new kinds of questions -- what are commonly thought of as the central questions of metaethics. Deigh's discussion of practical reason and moral psychology shows how, through the denial of the kind of freedom radical choice implies, we might confront the existentialist challenge concerning the exercise of human freedom. Deigh concludes with a critique of these responses, canvassing several different conceptions of practical reasoning, none of which is obviously superior to or more authoritative than the existentialist conception of how we ought to live. Nonetheless, Deigh thinks the argument does not demonstrate the primacy of existentialism; that conclusion, he argues convincingly, would be too hasty.

There are myriad introductions to ethics available, many of them addressing topics absent from Deigh's book. For instance, there is no extended treatment of relativism, virtue ethics, or the fact-value problem. But this should not, in my judgment, be regarded as a short-coming. Deigh has identified an overarching storyline to the development of ethics, and he sticks to it. The result is an uncluttered presentation that invites the reader to engage in further ethical enquiry. (I do think that, as an introductory text, the book would be improved by including a more extensive -- and perhaps annotated -- list of additional readings. That would make it an ideal text for adoption in an undergraduate ethics course.) While I have tried to raise a few quibbles here and there, there is very little to which one can reasonably object in this admirable text.