An Introduction to Kant's Aesthetics

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Christian Helmut Wenzel, An Introduction to Kant's Aesthetics, Blackwell, 2005, 183 pp., $24.95, (pbk), ISBN 1405130369.

Reviewed by Kenneth F. Rogerson, Florida International University


Wenzel’s book purports to be an introductory work on Kant’s “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” (the first half of the Critique of Judgment). Wenzel announces that the book is “not intended primarily for Kant scholars,” but is instead geared toward “a wider audience including undergraduate and graduate students of philosophy…” Wenzel even claims that to access his book “no knowledge of Kant is presupposed.” (pg. xii) In spite of Wenzel’s intentions, however, I seriously doubt that someone unfamiliar with Kant and unfamiliar with the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” will be able to appreciate this book. The proper audience of Wenzel’s work likely is graduate and advanced undergraduate students. And, there is much in this book that scholars will find useful as well.

For the most part, Wenzel does not try to argue for an interpretation of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.” Rather, the purpose of the book is to give a fairly straightforward explication of the “Critique” (although, sometimes Wenzel’s own view sneaks in). While Wenzel avoids interpretative disputes in the text of his book per se, he has “Further Reading” notes at the end of each chapter where he indicates different positions on controversial issues. This provides a good departure point for those who wish to delve more deeply into the scholarship on Kant’s aesthetics. More than other English language books on Kant’s Aesthetics, Wenzel's discussion of the secondary works makes reference to works in German as well as work on the “Critique” from the perspective of Continental philosophy. Again, both of these features are rare in an English language study of Kant. In addition to the useful “Further Reading” section, there is a very handy glossary. Wenzel highlights the first use of technical Kantian terms providing the reader a reliable definition of these terms in the back of the book.

To some extent, Wenzel’s book mirrors the structure of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment”. Paralleling Kant’s earlier “Critiques” the work is divided into the Analytic of the Beautiful, the Analytic of the Sublime, the Deduction of Pure Judgments of Taste, and the Dialectic of the Aesthetic Judgment. While Wenzel covers the topics in each of these sections of the text, for good reason he does not give equal weight to each of Kant’s separate discussions. For example, he does not devote much discussion to the Sublime. This is entirely understandable. Many commentators see this discussion as a detour from Kant’s main emphasis on aesthetic beauty. Instead of giving equal weight to each section of the “Critique” Wenzel gives considerable priority to the discussion of the four “moments” of the Analytic of the Beautiful -- a separate chapter for each of the moments. There is no independent analysis of the Deduction or the Dialectic. However, certain specific issues from the Dialectic show up in chapter 5: Fine Art, Nature, and Genius, and in chapter 6: Beyond Beauty. Further, over and above the explication of the text, Wenzel also has a final chapter where he raises “Two Challenges” to Kant’s position on aesthetic judgements.

Wenzel’s choice to emphasize the Analytic is defensible. Many, but not all, commentators believe that the central job of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is to argue that aesthetic judgments can make a legitimate claim to subjective universal validity and that this argument is wholly contained in the Analytic -- despite what Kant sometimes seems to say. As such, Wenzel’s choice to discuss Kant’s Deduction within the context of the fourth moment of the Analytic, where Kant seems to give an argument supporting the “necessity” of judgments of taste, makes sense since such a necessity also seems to be the goal of the Deduction. Again, this way to focus in on the “Critique” will seem justifiable to many scholars. It is a common interpretation of the “Critique” to see the argument in the Deduction as merely repeating the argument already made in the fourth moment of the Analytic. If Wenzel can be faulted here, it is only that he needs better to explain his interpretative choices to “introductory” readers.

There are some other interpretative choices which Wenzel makes and which, perhaps, he also should have better explained to the reader. Kant’s aesthetic theory is often thought to be a kind of formalism, i.e. that our appreciation of beauty is to be concerned with the very way in which elements are arranged, not the nature of the elements themselves. To be sure Kant talks this way and sometimes seems to think that this position follows from his key notion of a free harmony (or as Wenzel prefers a “free play”) of the imagination and the understanding. However, in recent scholarship it has been argued that such a strict kind of formalism does not follow from the free harmony criteria. For example, it has been argued that beauty as the expression of aesthetic ideas, a doctrine developed in the latter sections of the “Critique” and to which Wenzel devotes little space, is at the very least consistent with the free harmony requirement (Paul Guyer has argued such a position). If this is a correct interpretation of Kant, and I think that it is, it very much complicates the story of Kant’s commitment to formalism.

By his own admission, Wenzel engages in a few “digressions” along the way in his description of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.” Prior to his analysis of the four moments of the Anayltic, he has a discussion of the notion of a “moment” in general including its present and past scientific uses. This discussion is interesting and well informed due to Wenzel's background in Mathematics. However given the compact nature of this book it may not have been the wisest use of limited space. The same can be said of his “side issue” discussion of Transcendental Logic within the analysis of the second moment of the Analytic. While well done in its own right, it is not clear that this discussion is terribly relevant to an understanding of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.”

As mentioned above, although this book is intended to give students a more or less straightforward explication of Kant’s position in the “Critique,” Wenzel allows himself a final chapter in which he raises some objections to Kant’s position -- chapter 7 entitled “Two Challenges.” One might question whether this is appropriate in an introductory text or whether it crosses the line toward a more scholarly work. I would defend Wenzel's choice to include some critical discussions. It is quite appropriate, even in an introductory book, to evaluate the ultimate success of Kant’s project. However, I would question the specific “challenges” that Wenzel addresses. The two problems that he discusses are the extent to which Kant’s account can have a place for objects that are “ugly” -- which is to say objects that should be judged aesthetically negative -- and whether there can be Beauty and Genius in Mathematics.

The fist issue, for which there has been some discussion in the literature (including an article by Wenzel) is the following. If Kant’s criteria for “beauty” (aesthetic goodness) is that an object is beautiful if and only if its appreciation engages in us a free harmony of the cognitive faculties, then one might think that to judge an object to be “ugly” would be to say that it does not engage such a harmony. However, Wenzel wants to say that not engaging free harmony may well explain why we would make a judgment of “not beautiful” but this is quite different from judging something to be positively “ugly.” He argues that in order for Kant to have an account of the “ugly” he needs to talk about a “disharmonious” play of the faculties. Wenzel further argues that while Kant does not explicitly hold such a position, it is consistent with the rest of Kant’s theory.

The second “challenge” that Wenzel considers is that of the possibility of Beauty and Genius in Mathematics -- again, a topic on which he has already published and in which he, as a mathematician, is particularly interested. Wenzel wonders whether Kant’s account of beauty can be extended to find room for the aesthetic appreciation of mathematics (for example, taking aesthetic pleasure in constructing proofs for theorems or even in creating a mathematical system). Could mathematics be considered an area for genius (surely we use the term this way) to create something of beauty? Wenzel argues that, with a little effort, we can apply a notion like free harmony of the imagination and understanding to the project of mathematics -- particularly in the more creative enterprises of mathematics.

The “challenges” raised in the above two cases and Wenzel’s defense of them are very nicely done; however, one can question the relative importance of these two issues. I would think that there are several problem areas in Kant’s aesthetics that deserve more attention than the two Wenzel chooses. I shall mention only a couple such issues here. The central argument of the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is the justification of the subjective universal validity of judgments of taste. The interpretation of this central argument is controversial for a number of reasons. First, it is not altogether clear where this argument occurs or what elements it uses. Some commentators believe that the entire argument is completed in the “Analytic of the Beautiful,” particularly paragraphs 9 and 21. Others, like Henry Allison, believe that Kant also requires the official “Deduction” given in paragraph 38. Still others believe that Kant’s argument to universal validity requires the connection with morality argued for largely in the “Dialectic.” Yet, not only is there controversy about what are the elements of the argument but, naturally enough, there is further controversy over the ultimate success of any version of this argument. Unfortunately, Wenzel does not spend sufficient time on this issue.

Another central issue that gets short shrift in Wenzel’s book is the notion of a free harmony of the imagination and understanding. Many scholars have noted that there is something deeply paradoxical about this notion. Kant holds that aesthetic appreciation is a matter of finding a manifold of sense perception in conformity with the rule-orderly function of the understanding -- more simply, aesthetic appreciation is a matter of finding orderliness in a given set of sense perceptions. This seems straightforward enough. However, Kant also holds that we are to find this rule-orderliness somehow without discerning or applying any sort of rules (free from rules). It is far from clear how or if this can be done. Since free harmony plays such a central role in Kant’s aesthetics, it is quite important to explain how to make sense of such a paradoxical notion. Again, one would have wished that Wenzel had paid a bit more attention to this issue.

Despite my quibbles, there is a lot to recommend this book. Wenzel brings an interesting perspective to the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.” Wenzel is German and there are few studies of the “Critique” written originally in English by a German. Wenzel is also a mathematician and this training informs both his discussions of the “Moments” of the Analytic and the concern with whether mathematics can be beautiful. Further, Wenzel, more than most commentators, is quite good at giving actual aesthetic examples to help illustrate his understanding of Kant’s position.

Wenzel also brings a considerable knowledge of the history of thought, philosophical and otherwise, as background to Kant’s position on Aesthetics. This is particularly apparent in his discussion of the “sensus communis” in the fourth moment. It is quite helpful to see how the idea of sensus communis was being used at the time to better understand the point that Kant is making in this portion of the text. Similarly, the discussion under the heading of “How to Read Section 9" (of the Second Moment) is very well done. Wenzel takes one of the most difficult sections of the “Critique” and gives the reader a fairly clear sense of what Kant is up to here. Finally, it should be mentioned that Wenzel’s book has a very nice Forward by Henry Allison. Allison’s consenting to write a Forward is evidence of the high quality of this book. In sum, I highly recommend this book to students and scholars with some familiarity with Kant and the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment.” This book will surely deepen their understanding of Kant.