An Introduction to Kant's Moral Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Jennifer K. Uleman, An Introduction to Kant's Moral Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 189pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521136440.

Reviewed by Gunnar Hindrichs, Ruprecht-Karls-Universität Heidelberg


There are many introductions to philosophical topics on the market, and most of them are dull but dutiful. This one is not.

To be sure, it is dutiful. Jennifer K. Uleman's book presents the state of the art, and it provides all the information that the reader needs if she wishes to acquire a good overview of Kant's moral philosophy. The book defines the general outline and the main topics of Kant's thought; it makes explicit premises and implications; it points out difficulties and problems; and it sketches the historical setting. Its prose is clear and elegant, its structure is well-organized. These achievements alone make the book a helpful and recommendable introduction. But Uleman does more: she pursues a philosophical idea. Her idea is to interpret Kant's moral philosophy as a theory of human life. Deontology, formalism, and abstract intelligibility are not the prime features in Kant; rather, his moral thought is a persuasive and substantial articulation of the notion of human beings as rational animals in the full sense of the term. This is the focus of the book, and it comes across in a powerful and reverberatory way. The book provides an introduction to Kant's moral philosophy that is not ashamed of interpretation and is willing to make a point, and it is therefore a highly profitable read for beginners and scholars alike.

The book has in eight chapters. The first introduces Kant's concept of the free rational will and argues for its importance for moral philosophy. The second chapter gives a sketch of Kant's conception of the human subject, insofar as it is related to the free rational will, and juxtaposes the concepts of desire, choice, and will. The third chapter adds depth to the sketch and exposes the structure of practical reason: rules, laws, principles, maxims, imperatives, and the categorical imperative. The fourth chapter completes the sketch by clarifying Kant's idea of freedom. The fifth chapter discusses Kant's argument against a naturalist foundation of morality. The sixth chapter elucidates the categorical imperative, debating the charge of formalism and emphasizing the imperative's content. The seventh chapter gives reasons for the moral appeal of the Kantian will. And the eighth chapter gives a short summary of the argument in favour of Kant's moral philosophy as a theory of human life. The book concludes with a bibliography, mainly consisting of books and articles in English. (Unfortunately, the non-English scholarship that could have helped Uleman best to sharpen her interpretative claim is neglected, most notably the work of Gerhard Krüger and Dieter Henrich.)

Let us turn directly to Uleman's interpretative idea. The crux consists in the following: The human will is a "strange thing", as Kant says. It is free in a determined world, it subjects itself to itself, and it is itself the aim of morality. Uleman's book is devoted to articulating this strange thing. In order to do so, it interprets the human will as "free rational will". The formula "free rational will" cannot be decomposed into its components; rather, each of its terms implicates and depends on the others. Thus, the ordinary usage of the terms does not fit Kant's theory. Now, in order to understand the formula, we have to understand the interconnections of its terms. The will is free if it determines itself and is not determined by anything else, i.e., if it chooses its ends on grounds that are its own grounds. These grounds can be arbitrary, but they are nonetheless connected to reason, because they can or cannot respond to rational demands that are not arbitrary. Thus, the free will can become rational free will. If so, its freedom will be transformed into a freedom that transcends merely indeterminate spontaneity in favour of rational determination. The will, which is a function of the grounds determining action and which can begin its own unconditioned beginnings, is then responding to reason, which is the source of the grounds whose function the will is. Such service completes the freedom of will. The formula "free rational will" claims to describe this fulfilment.

Why is the rational determination of will in harmony with its indeterminacy through external grounds? Because the grounds provided by reason are internal grounds of the will. Freedom is to be understood in two respects. The first, which can be equated to "negative freedom", consists in the choice of an action (Willkür). Such choice is guided by certain grounds but is not determined by them. The action is not beyond our control. But if the grounds that guide our choice stem from external sources, such as the laws of nature and society, the freedom of choice is substantiated in an unfree way. Accordingly, the grounds whose function the will is have to be considered in terms of freedom's substantiation. To substantiate freedom, however, means to act on grounds that are our own. Grounds that are our own, in turn, cannot be grounds that are given from elsewhere. They have to be submitted to our own practical judgement. Submitting grounds to our own practical judgement means to transform them into grounds examined and controlled. Such examination is the work of reason. For reason is able to give the law according to which the judgment can be made, and reason is able to provide the argument in acceptance of which one or the other ground is chosen. Reason controls the grounds of action. But to control our action was the aim of freedom already in the first respect. The capacity to choose freely is thus completed by the rational constraint of grounds for action. Accordingly, freedom in the second respect, which can be equated to "positive freedom", consists in the actor's rational self-determination.

To sum up, freedom in the first sense is a capacity that is characterized by the fact that the human will is not determined by something external to itself, whereas freedom in the second sense is the treatment of that capacity as something that is pursued for its own sake, so that a reflexive determination of will through itself can happen. In other words, freedom in the first sense is the free choice between given contents, while freedom in the second sense is the rational self-determination of free choice toward a free, i.e., internally generated, content. Free choice is not compelled through any eternal law; free rational will gives itself a law. The latter is, as Uleman likes to point out in Hegel's words, "the free will which wills the free will."

Usually, the step from freedom in the first sense to freedom in the second sense is explained in terms of formalism. The law that free rational will gives itself is, of course, the moral law expressed by the categorical imperative. It urges the free will to will itself. But it does so, one can argue, by imposing a formal procedure on our free choice. The content of the moral law is derived from the form that moral principles must take in order to avoid their determination through external instances. And this might prompt a theory that identifies the moral law as a rule of calculation: when we follow the command of the categorical imperative, we calculate whether the content of our ends fits into the form of the moral law. But Uleman argues forcefully that Kant's formalism must not be confused with a conception of calculative reason. Against this "cold fish" view of the categorical imperative, a view that she identifies with the theories of John Rawls, Christine Korsgaard, and Onora O'Neill, Uleman mobilizes the emotional investments, commitments, and interests that are entailed by the moral law. To be sure, all of these are "pure", i.e., they are emotional investments, commitments, and interests determined by reason. But nonetheless, they are emotional investments, commitments, and interests. These rational emotions, commitments, and interests, of which Kant's idea of respect (Achtung) is the most prominent and most suspect, tighten the moral law to the forms of life. The categorical imperative thus acquires lived-life plausibility. It becomes a matter of ennoblement and a productive force of our practical identity in the full sense. Rather than being obsessed with rules, calculation, and the suppression of emotions, Kant's moral law is the substantiation of free choice through respect and commitments in reference to the demands of practical reason. The formal requirements that the categorical imperative issues thus generate content: they embody the idea of the good that offers guidance, dignity, and meaning to our life.

The satisfactions that a life listening to the categorical imperative can acquire are manifold. Uleman's enumeration comprises (i) elevation above nature, (ii) power and agency, (iii) self-sufficiency, (iv) self-contentment, (v) regularity, (vi) universality, (vii) infinity, and (viii) creativity. All of these moments point towards Idealist interpretations and transformations of Kant, especially to those of Schiller and, again, Hegel, although Uleman does not discuss this connection in detail. Her claim is that Kant has already done what his immediate successors saw as the implicit but not fully accomplished end of his account of practical reason: to flesh out our practical identity as substantiation of the structure of free willing -- a substantiation that materializes the formal demands of the categorical imperative as the positive freedom of a life in dignity and creativity.

Uleman's approach is liberating. It is an introduction to a Kantian morality that transcends the clichés of formalism and calculative reason and reminds us of the moral life that is implied in the idea of a free rational will. The conception of our practical self advances into the centre of Kant's ethical thought. However, there are at least two lacunae that have to be filled for this introduction to Kant's moral philosophy to be complete and its interpretation as a theory of human life defensible. These lacunae are Kant's notion of the "fact of reason" and the postulates of practical reason. Both are central ideas in Kant's moral thought, and both are neglected by Uleman. The notion of the "fact of reason" is Kant's answer to the question of moral foundations. It says that moral demands cannot be inferred from elsewhere but are a "fact", though not an empirical fact, at which moral reasoning finds its end. This idea implies that moral insight amounts to respect for the moral law. Kant's difficult argument for this idea consists in the negative proof that all ways to infer moral demands are doomed to fail, especially those ways that attempt to deduce morality from nature and society. Given the success of his argument, and given that his argument for the specific form of the moral law, viz., the categorical imperative, is also successful, he concludes that this form has to be accepted without further proof of its validity. The moral law is valid through itself. This line of argument, together with its implications for the idea of moral insight, is not present in Uleman's thought. Is it too authoritarian for her humanist point of view?

The second lacuna, the postulates of pure reason, is equally central to Kant's moral thought, although, admittedly, not very cherished by his contemporary followers. The arguments that we have to presuppose metaphysical (not just practical) freedom, the immortality of the soul, and the existence of God, if we act morally, rests on the proposition that the good has to be possible if we consistently want to act in accordance with it. The categorical imperative does not establish that the good that it prescribes can be actualized in the world. We thus need a God who has created the world in such a way that our good actions are in accordance with determinate events. We need a soul that is immortal in order to be able to acquire the complete happiness for which we become worthy through our good actions. And we need metaphysical freedom in order to bind the structure of free will to an entity in the world, namely a person. In short, we need to postulate the three objects of traditional metaphysics, immortality of the soul, freedom, and God, if we want to conceive our moral activity as actualized in the world. But all this seems to violate the humanist, non-metaphysical interpretation of Kant's thought, and it is thus no wonder that Uleman does not waste many words on it. In truth, however, the notorious postulates of practical reason contribute to Uleman's own interpretative idea. They materialize the formal structure of free rational will and thus structure a human life in dignity and creativity.

Be that as it may, a completely convincing introduction to Kant's moral philosophy would have to include these two central claims. For the rest, however, Uleman's book is an excellent interpretation that has freed Kant from the cage of abstract normativity and has reintroduced him into the midst of human life.