An Introduction to Mill's Utilitarian Ethics

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West, Henry, An Introduction to Mill's Utilitarian Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 228pp, $20.00 (pbk.), ISBN 0521535417

Reviewed by Ben Eggleston, University of Kansas


The most distinctive feature of Henry West’s new book An Introduction to Mill’s Utilitarian Ethics is signaled by its title. Whereas most introductions to Mill’s ethics largely restrict their attention to Mill’s Utilitarianism, West’s book treats that essay as but one source among many. To be sure, West draws on that source more than on any other. But he also relies heavily on A System of Logic, the Autobiography, and many others of Mill’s books, essays, and letters. As a result, West illuminates Mill’s ethical thought from many directions, giving it a depth and a richness that cannot be conveyed by even the most penetrating analysis of Utilitarianism alone. In short, even scholars and students who know every nuance of Utilitarianism can benefit from the broader focus offered by West’s book.

The book begins with a brief introduction and a chapter on Mill’s life and philosophical background, highlighting the direct and indirect influence of Bentham. West then devotes a chapter to Mill’s reasons for rejecting three prominent non-utilitarian approaches to ethics: ethics based on divine command, ethics based on the notion of what is natural or on (what is perceived by some to be the content of) natural law, and ethics of the intuitionist school. Already with this chapter, the broader focus of West’s book begins to pay dividends, since Mill says so little about these rival approaches (especially the first two) in Utilitarianism, and yet a rejection of each of them is, West shows, very much a part of Mill’s ethical thought. Even Mill’s rejection of intuitionistic ethics—expressed in the third paragraph of Utilitarianism—is illuminated by West’s discussion, which helpfully reveals some of the assumptions apparently underlying Mill’s brief attack on that rival approach.

A reader working through West’s book in the way he recommends would, if new to Mill’s ethics, turn next to the appendix, which provides a 26-page summary of Utilitarianism. This summary displays the structure of Mill’s essay clearly, is judicious in its emphasis, and conveys the content of the essay accurately. Scholars familiar with Utilitarianism will find no surprises here, but might admire West’s thoroughness and strict impartiality; and students new to Utilitarianism could benefit from being counseled to read this summary, even if they are not also reading any of the rest of the book.

Each of the remaining five chapters discusses a central topic in Mill’s ethical thought: the possibility of qualitative differences among pleasures (chapter 3), whether Mill’s theory is one of act utilitarianism or rule utilitarianism (chapter 4), the nature of moral motivation (chapter 5), Mill’s proof of the principle of utility (chapter 6), and the conflict between utility and justice (chapter 7). In each case, West’s treatment offers not only charitable interpretation of Mill, but also attempts at vindication against various objections, attempts that involve proposed repairs and occasionally even replacements for Mill’s claims and arguments. The first two of these five chapters are the most significant, so I will discuss them at some length before remarking briefly on the remaining three.

West’s chapter on Mill’s doctrine of qualitative differences among pleasures is his richest and his most complicated. After summarizing Mill’s view, West adduces some remarks from Francis Hutcheson’s A System of Moral Philosophy suggesting that Hutcheson held a view anticipating the essentials of Mill’s (pp. 51–52). Then, West introduces the three Millian claims whose clarification, possible proof, and overall assessment set the agenda for the chapter. “One is that there are qualitative differences between pleasures as pleasures. Another is that some of these are superior to others on grounds of quality. A third is that the qualitatively superior are those that involve the distinctively human faculties” (p. 53). The ensuing pages present reasons for endorsing the first two claims, along with some doubts about the third. They also contain intricate discussions of the phenomenology of pleasant experience (including West’s suggestion of second-order pleasures, such as the pleasure one takes in being susceptible to certain pleasures), of different ways of interpreting Mill’s remarks about how to certify one pleasure as superior to another, of the priority of the superiority of a pleasure to its being preferred, and of whether qualitative difference amounts to incommensurability (West says no). Throughout the chapter, West’s discussions are psychologically insightful, philosophically sound, and impressively precise. But despite the chapter’s orientation around the three claims earlier identified, West investigates so many related claims, both large and small, that its overall message is hard to discern. For many readers, this chapter may be more valuable as a series of short discussions illuminating small points than as a coherent whole providing them with a unified theory of higher and lower pleasures to regard as Mill’s (or to subscribe to in place of Mill’s).

West’s most interesting and novel chapter addresses the oft-debated question of whether Mill is better understood as an act utilitarian or as a rule utilitarian—whether, in Mill’s view, the rightness of an act depends only on its production of the best possible consequences in the specific situation, or whether the rightness of an act depends on its compliance with rules whose broad acceptance produces the best consequences in general. This is still very much a live issue among interpreters of Mill, but almost all interpreters have two things in common. First, they maintain that whether Mill is better understood as an act utilitarian or as a rule utilitarian, he also embraced what West calls “a multilevel view for decision making”—a view according to which an agent is likely to produce the best possible consequences by making only some decisions by choosing the act that appears to have the best possible consequences, while making other decisions in accordance with carefully selected rules, as required by social practices, or on the basis of certain dispositions. Second, almost all interpreters of Mill countenance the multilevel structure as an option only for Mill’s view of decision-making, not as a possibility for Mill’s view of right action. West, however—after rehearsing some of the problematic passages in Mill’s works for both the act-utilitarian interpretation and the rule-utilitarian interpretation—suggests that Mill has not only a multilevel view for decision-making, but also a multilevel view for right action (p. 78). On this view, in some situations, the right thing to do is determined by an act-utilitarian standard of rightness, and in other situations, it is determined by something else, such as a rule-utilitarian standard of rightness. As West explains, “This is not merely the strategic use of rules to achieve the act having the best consequences, but the recognition that some areas of social life require authoritative rules that are not to be violated for marginally better consequences and some areas in which there are no such rules but that are still subject to moral sanction” (p. 84). Apparently, though, there are not just two criteria of rightness in the structure West has in mind. In considering alternatives to the act-utilitarian criterion of rightness, West mentions not only the rule-utilitarian one but also a rights-based one and a virtue-based one, and says that “each of these procedures may have an appropriate place in an overall utilitarian moral system, and following one of these indirect procedures is the right act to perform” (pp. 86–87). Unfortunately West leaves underspecified the content of the principle or principles that he thinks Mill would regard as demarcating the domains of the different criteria of rightness; in what sense do some areas of life “require” (as West says) one criterion of rightness rather than another? But West’s proposal has some initial plausibility—and certainly much initial interest as a way of breaking the stalemate some see on this question—and it surely deserves further investigation.

The last three chapters of West’s book correspond to the last three chapters of Mill’s. West’s chapter on moral motivation provides helpful background for Mill’s short third chapter of Utilitarianism by explaining his associationist psychology, opposition to the doctrine of free will, and views on justifiable punishment. West’s penultimate chapter offers a charitable reconstruction of Mill’s long-ridiculed, but recently reconsidered, proof of the principle of utility. This chapter is particularly strong in its discussion of Mill’s claim that that only evidence we have that something is desirable is that people desire it. According to West, this claim is more a denial of any sort of intuitionism—“Mill is denying that we intuit what is intrinsically a good in some directly cognitive way” (p. 126)—than any evidence of any neglect, by Mill, of the fact–value divide. Finally, the last chapter of West’s book is essentially a short essay on the conflict between utility and justice. It discusses some of the main points of chapter 5 of Utilitarianism but is more concerned with distributive justice than Mill is and so offers less an exegesis of Mill’s chapter than some cogent reflections on the extent and defensibility of utilitarianism’s incompatibility with traditional maxims of fairness.

Stylistically, West’s book is somewhat mixed. His writing is admirably clear, and his perspicuous organization of topics within chapters partially mitigates the regrettable absence of formal section divisions within chapters. When West quotes Mill, he consistently includes the page number from the Collected Works, and he helpfully includes the chapter and paragraph number for sources often labeled in that way (including, of course, Utilitarianism). Unfortunately, however, West has a tendency to paraphrase Mill so closely that a reader not sufficiently acquainted with Mill’s work to notice the closeness of the paraphrase at the time, but who later reads Mill attentively enough to appreciate the closeness of the paraphrase, might reasonably feel entitled to have had it noted by West in his text. A second, even more minor, stylistic problem is due to West’s “effort … to add the feminine pronoun [when quoting Mill] when the masculine is used to refer to a representative human being” (p. 2, fn. 8). Although any effort to use gender-neutral language is, of course, laudable (and one that Mill would surely have endorsed, as West notes), West’s decision results in some awkward revisions, perhaps the worst of which is the interpolation of the phrases ‘[or she]’ and ‘[or her]’ no fewer than eight times in the space of just a two-sentence passage (pp. 114–115).

Even counting these stylistic miscues as minor demerits, West’s book is first-rate. As an exegesis of Mill’s Utilitarianism, it does not quite rival Roger Crisp’s recent contribution to Routledge’s current series of “guidebooks” to major works. But as what its title promises—an introduction to Mill’s ethical thought (spanning all the works by Mill in which it is expressed)—West’s book is unequaled. It is obviously the product of decades of study of both primary and secondary sources (an effort few readers will be capable of replicating themselves), and anyone interested in Mill’s views on ethics will profit immensely from the fruits of West’s labors.