An Introduction to Philosophical Methods

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Chris Daly, An Introduction to Philosophical Methods, Broadview Press, 2010, 257pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551119342.

Reviewed by Jonathan Ichikawa, Arché Philosophical Research Centre, University of St Andrews


It is no small feat to say anything that is at once interesting, general, and plausible about philosophical methodology. Even setting aside their notorious epistemological challenges, attempts to understand philosophical investigation in a sui generis way inevitably leave out those branches of philosophy whose practitioners produce work nearly indistinguishable from that produced in other academic departments -- compare the closely related work of philosophers of language to that of semanticists in linguistics departments, or that of philosophers of physics to that of theoretical physicists. And more inclusive discussions of the methodology of philosophy run the risk of generating lists of tautologies -- believe according to the evidence, make good inferences, do not beg questions against dialectical opponents, etc. -- rather than informative treatments of how philosophy ought to proceed.

In his new book, An Introduction to Philosophical Methods, Chris Daly attempts to characterize the methodology of philosophy. How does his project fare with respect to the challenge sketched above? Daly has made the prudent decision not to advance any grand, unifying statement of the nature or methodology of philosophy, instead electing for what he calls (p. 11) a 'twin track' approach, considering particular methods and kinds of data that philosophers sometimes appear to use, and pairing descriptions of such methods with various case studies intended to illustrate them. This restricted strategy does seem advisable; the nature of philosophy is best understood through methodologically reflective first-order philosophical practice. However, its proponent does run the risk of having little of interest, and little distinctive of philosophy, to say, thus succumbing to the latter horn of the dilemma set out above. Daly's book does, to some extent, so succumb.

Daly does little in the book to characterize how he thinks philosophy might differ from other kinds of engagement. The extended discussion of science in Chapter Six considers how science may bear on philosophy but does not engage with how it is and is not similar. He does point out (p. 1) that philosophers are unlike scientists in that they do not use laboratory tools to run experiments, but this does little to distinguish philosophy in particular. The book does not mention those intellectual domains that are neither philosophy nor ones prototypically involving laboratory experiments -- economics, history, sociology, theoretical physics, journalism, anthropology, mathematics, etc. Since the central puzzle motivating the book, as given in the introductory pages, involves the juxtaposition of, first, the propensity of philosophers to, to use Daly's term, 'make various claims' with, second, their neglect of laboratory experiments, this does seem a significant omission. Does a precisely analogous puzzle demand special consideration of the methodology of economics? Perhaps it does—this is not obviously implausible—but a more forceful introduction to the present book might include a discussion of to what extent, if any, the questions raised are particularly pressing for philosophy.

The book comprises six chapters, plus a brief introduction and conclusion. Each chapter involves an initial set of methodological questions and consideration of one or more case studies designed to illustrate how the questions bear on philosophical methodology. For example, the first chapter, 'Common Sense', opens with questions about the nature and significance of common sense claims, then focuses primarily on G. E. Moore's application of common sense arguments to philosophical questions, with particular emphasis on his infamously straightforward attempted proof of the external world.

While the general organizational strategy strikes me as a prudent one, it was not clear to me why Daly chose the topics he did and what unifies the work as a whole. The longest chapter of the book, the 62-page Chapter Two, 'Analysis', considers several attempts to analyze the notion of philosophical analysis and finds them inadequate in various respects before finally concluding very briefly (on p. 100) that the notion of analysis is not after all an interesting one for the purpose of understanding the methodology of philosophy. Although I agree with Daly's conclusion here, students engaging with the book will wonder, as I did, why we spent so much time on a question that was ultimately to be dismissed? Nothing earlier in the chapter adequately motivates why anyone might have thought that understanding the nature of analysis was particularly important or why any of the particular attempts to characterize analysis considered were thought plausible.

The third chapter is devoted to 'Thought Experiment'. It begins with general questions about the nature and value of thought experiments before giving brief introductions to seventeen well-known examples of thought experiments, plus a more extended case study of thought experiments involving personal identity. Daly's ultimate take on thought experiments is not entirely clear. On one hand, he suggests (pp. 123-4) that thought experiments need to be evaluated on a case-by-case basis for their relevance, coherence, etc. This is very plausible, but stands in some tension with the idea that there is something interesting and general to be said about thought experiments learned from the method of case studies. But Daly also concludes the chapter (pp. 127-8) with what he calls the 'tentative and speculative sceptical proposal' that use of intuition and consideration of hypothetical cases are irrelevant to philosophical questions. (Whether he means this to apply in the case of all questions, or only some representative proportion of them, is not clear.) Taking the example of thought experiments used to evaluate theories of knowledge, Daly suggests that we dispense with thought experiments and intuitions and observe only that knowledge and reliably produced true belief are in fact coextensive. Then we may infer to the best explanation that they are identical. This very radical suggestion raises many serious questions which go unaddressed: can one correlate actual cases of knowledge to reliably produced true belief without making use of the sorts of intuitions Daly wants to set aside? Are not non-hypothetical instances of ignorant but reliably produced true belief sufficient to refute the proposed identity? The two paragraphs Daly devotes to his 'sceptical proposal' -- which are not at all intimately connected to the discussion of more mainstream ideas in the chapter -- are not adequate to the extreme view articulated, even if only speculatively.

Next is Chapter Four, 'Simplicity', which examines how considerations of simplicity and complexity bear on appropriate selection of hypotheses; the main focus is on various interpretations of Occam's Razor. Daly's conclusion here (p. 152) is that given the various notions of simplicity available, and given the availability of reasons to tolerate complex hypotheses, considerations of simplicity are 'quite restricted' in their applicability to philosophical methodology.

In Chapter Five ('Explanation'), Daly considers the extent to which philosophical theories do and should explain. In particular, he considers the suggestion that, when choosing between hypotheses, we should select that which offers the best explanation of the relevant phenomena. Of course, there are difficult and interesting questions about just what explanation consists in, how to distinguish cases of explanation from non-explanation, and how to determine which of various competing explanations is in the relevant sense 'better'. Daly says little about these questions, noting (p. 180) that 'the strategy of inference to the best explanation needs to be supplemented not only by detailed accounts of each of the theoretical virtues, but also by a detailed account of how to make a rational theory choice in [various cases].' This is surely right; but absent any such detailed account -- or even a vague, impressionistic account -- the suggestion threatens to be all but empty.

Chapter Six, 'Science', is not about science per se, but instead considers the bearing of science on philosophy. The bulk of the chapter consists in putting forward and criticizing arguments for naturalism, which Daly officially characterizes as 'The view that scientific methods and results are valuable, or even indispensable, to philosophy.' However, he also cautions the reader that 'no single view can be identified with naturalism.' (p. 188) Unfortunately, in much of the ensuing discussion, Daly does not keep various naturalist theses distinct, in several dimensions. For instance, Daly argues against naturalizing epistemology in part by claiming (p. 199) that the psychological claims that might be of relevance to epistemology -- our susceptibility to various errors in perception, reasoning, etc. -- consist largely in 'something we already knew, at least in broad outline'. While this may provide some insulation against the methodological suggestion that one must formally study psychology in order to do epistemology responsibly, it does not show, as Daly suggests it does, that scientific information is not relevant to epistemology. This point is particularly clear if one considers how, by parity of reasoning, one could argue from the fact cited above -- common sense already told us that we perform less well epistemically in certain kinds of environments -- that the data provided by science is not relevant to cognitive psychology. In both cases, philosophy and cognitive psychology, that common sense already delivered the broad outlines of the relevant information is a non sequitur with respect to the general bearing of scientific evidence. Daly also seems at times to conflate the suggestion that scientific work bears on philosophical questions ('it is perfectly appropriate to draw on the resources (e.g.) of science', p. 200, quoting Hilary Kornblith) with the suggestion that scientific evidence and methodology are sufficient for resolving the relevant philosophical questions (a 'discipline or theory can generate a problem but it does not follow that its resources are sufficient to solve that problem', p. 202).

After these six chapters, Daly gives a three-and-a-half page conclusion that puts forward two more general ideas about philosophy. The first is that although there is philosophical debate about what data and methods are appropriate to the practice of philosophy, it is permissible when engaging in first-order philosophy to proceed from contentious or debatable assumptions. This claim does sit in some obvious prima facie tension with various accusations throughout the book -- for instance, on pp. 27, 33, 115, and 177 -- that certain arguments beg questions in pernicious ways, and with the statement on p. 115 that 'begging the question is a defect in any piece of reasoning'. This tension is not explored.[1] The second idea of the conclusion is that often a method of cost-benefit analysis is appropriate to choosing between philosophical theories. This idea, while plausible and useful, is not obviously connected to or developed from the discussion of the main text.

In general, Daly's writing style is reasonably clear, although he does tend to transition rather suddenly from general conversational tones to more technical ones that might confuse or intimidate students. This happens most often when he draws on work from other academics that speaks to the issues he has introduced. Daly often introduces an issue himself, in terms suitable for introductory students, then shifts without transition into a presentation of someone else's much more advanced argument; this often includes the incorporation of direct quotation, which is not always clearly extracted or explained. In a passage representative of the pattern, he considers (pp. 24-25) the question of what distinguishes 'common sense' claims from others; in two brief paragraphs, students are introduced to Jerry Fodor's modularity-of-mind thesis and to Keith Campbell's suggestion that this could provide a basis for distinguishing purely observational judgments from more theory-laden ones. Although Daly notes that this cannot constitute a criterion for common sense, since some Moorean certainties are not directly observational (the earth has existed for centuries, etc.), he suggests -- citing, but not explaining, Campbell -- that the empirical questions might nevertheless help. Few students at an introductory level could, I suspect, engage this passage with anything like full clarity without quite a lot of guidance. This is a representative pattern that occurs many times in the book. (E.g., a detour from common sense into a discussion of Michael Dummett and a distinction between belief and acceptance on p. 19; a presentation of Steven Rieber's application of a technical notion of semantic structure to bear on questions of analysis on p. 66; the consideration of a dialectic between Kathleen Wilkes and James Robert Brown on personal identity on p. 118.)

More advanced students or researchers will have an easier time following these parts of the book, but they, I think, will be frustrated by the superficial treatments of the interesting issues raised in the case studies. And in some instances, these latter seem also to involve philosophical errors and confusions (for example, in the discussions of the Euthyphro’s famous argument about piety and god-lovedness and of David Lewis’s modal realism).

The book would also have benefitted from more careful editing; there are a surprising number of typos -- including one on the first page of the introduction -- and grammatical/structural errors. These are not serious philosophical matters, of course, and would easily be fixed; I mention them because an introductory text read by philosophy students will provide a model for their own writing, and it is best to expose them to writing of the highest technical quality.

An Introduction to Philosophical Methods does touch upon many issues worthy of engagement, and Daly does seem to have done well in selecting the relevant literature to consider with respect to each of his chosen topics. As a result, the references and bibliography in this book will be useful for philosophers looking for guidance in their early research efforts. But with respect to its central aim as an introduction to philosophical methodology, the book falls short.

[1] Daly suggests (p. 158) that 'tension' in contexts like this is 'a weasel word' that should be avoided because it is unclear what exactly it is meant to convey. I do not agree that this sort of language is in general inappropriately vague. At any rate, in this instance, when I say that these elements of Daly's view are 'in tension,' I mean that there is sufficient prima facie conflict such that someone averring both views ought to recognize that they constitute a surprising conjunction and remark on how, contrary to appearance, they may be consistent and mutually well-motivated. I suspect this is approximately what most philosophers mean when they say that various claims are 'in tension' with one another.