Analogia Entis: Metaphysics: Original Structure and Universal Rhythm

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Erich Przywara, Analogia Entis: Metaphysics: Original Structure and Universal Rhythm, John R. Betz and David Bentley Hart (trs.), Eerdmans, 2014, 628pp., $60.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802868596.

Reviewed by Christopher J. Malloy, University of Dallas


The publication of Erich Przywara's Analogia Entis (1889-1972) is a major, welcome event, especially in the English speaking theological world. Przywara's work, which engaged theological and philosophical traditions from Plato to Heidegger, from Dionysius and Augustine to Aquinas, influenced Hans Urs von Balthasar and Karl Rahner; it resonates with the thought of Radical Orthodoxy and that of Jean-Luc Marion. Despite these influences and resonances, few English-speaking readers have studied Przywara. This edition leaves little more to be desired. It includes not only the classic monograph Analogia Entis (1932), but also over 300 pages of Przywara's later relevant essays, and John Betz's finely crafted 116 page Introduction.

Przywara aims, ultimately, to defend philosophically a declaration of the Fourth Lateran Council: "Because a similitude between the creator and the creature cannot be discerned without there being a greater dissimilitude between them to be noted." In "The Scope of Analogy as a Fundamental Catholic Form," Przywara discusses the context: Joachim of Fiore's distorted stress on the similitude between the union of Christians with God (or, it should be added, with each other) and Trinitarian unity, to the neglect of divine transcendence (Jn 17:22). For the council, the similar oneness is diversely realized: as the divine persons have unity of an identical nature, Christians have union of charity in grace. The scholastic tradition calls this structure "analogy of proportionality," a comparison of proportions. So, the "because" offers the reason why one must not think the perfection constitutes a common genus.

Przywara labored in a rather different context. Contrary to Joachim's anthropomorphism, the dialectical theology of the early Karl Barth stressed divine otherness to the point of eclipsing the creature. Although questioning his thought after a visit from Przywara, Barth finally pronounced the analogy of being "the invention of Antichrist." On the other hand, Heidegger had renounced Scotus's notion of the univocity of being and pursued the question of the Being of beings: why should there be anything rather than nothing? Attending to the facticity and temporality of man's existing in the world, the early Heidegger simply did not consider God. He later denounced attempts of reason to disclose truths concerning God as an "onto-theology" that constricts God by its anticipation. Thus, Heidegger seems not to have entertained a rationally discernible similitude between God and the creature. In this extramural context Przywara defended the similitude without infringing dissimilitude. Betz lucidly describes this context and couples it with a nuanced, intelligible discussion of Przywara's work.

In the book's Introduction, Betz does not substantively discuss the intramural, i.e., scholastic, context, the importance of which has returned because of Steven Long's work on Analogia Entis, which defends Thomas's ongoing appreciation of proportionality against decades of scholarship identifying a turn to the "proportion" of one to another. Przywara also decidedly favors proportionality. Further, neither Przywara nor the Introduction seriously discusses Scotus's rather subtle defense of the univocity of being, which provided a point of departure for important scholastic traditions. That Przywara focused his energy on presenting a case before the extramural forum may account for the notable brevity of his own treatment of the intramural disputes regarding analogy.

That focus and his own originality may also account for what appears to be Przywara's attempt to surmount all particular traditions of inquiry. In the monograph he considers Thomas his chief teacher, yet he already exhibits radical independence from his Master. Although he learns from Kant, Hegel, Husserl, and Heidegger, he is not a disciple of any of them. Further, Przywara's aim is to articulate the object or the act of a formal metaphysics as such, not of any particular metaphysics. This effort to articulate a formal conception independent of particular traditions accounts for the considerable difficulty it takes to access Przywara's novel vocabulary and complex argumentation. Consequently, his dialectical wrestling for a middle between one-sided positions does not quite exemplify what MacIntyre prescribes for engagement between rival traditions, unless Przwara has indeed achieved a superior point of view that gathers the various traditions. Determining whether this latter is the case would require an assessment of Przywara along the lines of MacIntyre's prescription.

In the monograph, which alone can be the focus here, the analogy of being is approached through an intricate series of related comparisons. How should metaphysics commence methodologically: with a primary intention immediately towards being (meta-ontics) or primarily with critical reflection on the act of knowledge (meta-noetics)? Characteristically, Przywara explores arguments for either side. Critical reflection must itself be examined, and it employs ontological categories; so, "it would seem that everything militates in favor" of a primarily meta-ontic method. Still, the latter would employ a "very particular epistemology," presuming "a complete adequation between knowledge and being" (122). Since this presupposition requires justification, the primacy of meta-noetic method is ineluctable even as this method is "pervaded" by the meta-ontic. The upshot: neither option should be pursued absolutely, but each in its order, culminating in an oscillating movement of one towards the other, just as being and consciousness cannot be isolated from one another. Przywara then tersely introduces the character of creaturely "becoming" as the already realized presence of what is still to be realized, coining the expression, "essence in-and-beyond existence," which phrase comes to be unpacked as meaning: the ideal (essence) already realized (in existence) and yet still to be realized (and beyond existence). The methodological oscillation reflects the ontological oscillation, which is objectively prior. These initial options are then taken up in connection with the transcendentals in Section 2, which reveal the implicit breadth of creaturely being.

Section 3 raises the question of the relation between the objects immediately given (fore-grounds) and their principle (backgrounds). To begin with the backgrounds and deduce the foregrounds from them is "a priori," as is Platonic thought on "eidos," whereas to begin with the foregrounds and move inductively towards the backgrounds is "a posteriori," as is Aristotle's study of immanent "morphe." Which approach to chose? The question can be asked with respect to the object and the act of knowledge. It would seem that regarding the object, an a posteriori approach should be primary. Nevertheless, Przywara holds that Aristotle's inductive method "appears almost to be, at this point, a mere exemplification, not a development from the purely empirical" (137). Przywara also submits that classical Thomism has not concrete things but "ideal universals" as object ("Phenomenology, Realogy, and Relationology," pp. 469). Thus, he grants a certain primacy to the a priori approach yet finds induction and deduction to be mutually dependent. What of the problematic of the act of knowledge? Evidently, the preceding analysis premised an a priori treatment of the act, as though only "pure thought" were the subject doing metaphysics, whereas a wide variety of historical contexts shape metaphysical questions and achievements. An a posteriori treatment of the act is thus also required. The reasonable option is between an objective aporetics -- a study of perennial problems that reduces the vicissitudes of history to these problems -- and an historical aporetics, which attends to the various systems, each as complete, yet aims to discern superhistorical truth therein. Both approaches are necessary and must be kept in proper tension, so that the one truth can be found "in-and-beyond history".

Section 4 transitions to the question of God and theology. A priori metaphysics deduces the many from the one, and a posteriori metaphysics infers the one from the many. Ultimately, each implies that the absolute (God) is in the relative (creature), yet each becomes extreme in isolation, the former reducing the creature to a passive manifestation of God or even totally displacing the creature by God (theopanism) and the latter suggesting the creature can fathom God or even rendering all creation as God (pantheism). From a proper assessment of the dynamism of this tension, a second formula emerges: God in-and-beyond the creature. The creature's unfolding (essence in-and-beyond existence) is ever upheld by the divine giving. The stress is clearly the divine absolute as beyond, as not "bound in any way intrinsically to this 'from (the creaturely),' but instead [presiding] independently over the manner of its own appearing" (p. 161).

Nevertheless, to acknowledge such independence of the divine requires revelation. Similarly, philosophy's study of the real creature is, while not false, only "provisional" (vorläufig) until faith and grace are explicitly considered. Thus, philosophical metaphysics, whose "formal subject" is the creature, first becomes conclusive (endgültig) through theology, which treats God in his revelation and everything else with reference to him. It turns out, claims Przywara, that only Catholic theology can achieve this, for it alone secures the "middle" between pantheism and theopanism. Thus, the philosophical must undergo an "internal transition" into the theological, which has God as its object of consideration. This transition is the ultimate upshot of the dictum "grace presupposes nature," which implies that nature must therefore be "intrinsically 'underway towards' grace," not because of a claim but because divine gratuity is prior. The philosophical does not itself become the theological; rather, it is liberated by the theological towards which it is actually heading.

In all this, God's transcendence should be increasingly appreciated. The relation captured by the expression "in-and-beyond" involves the denial of a third thing between God and creature (such as a perfection conceived as univocally common). Thus, the relation itself does not have a footing outside itself; it points beyond itself in a dynamic manner. Hence, it cannot be captured in a concept. The concept leads to a negative statement or a "reduction to mystery". The contrarieties of creatures are one in God, a coincidence of opposites, who remains totally unknown. In the reduction, one enters the mystery "in" but then "beyond" the concept, which is exploded but not falsified. The culmination is negative theology.

Section 5 tersely distinguishes analogy from logic and dialectic. Whereas the former tends toward a view of all from the one, the latter identifies problems or antitheses and, "far from providing a way of solution, it rather certifies the antitheses in their insolubility" (194). Or else, the Aristotelian and Hegelian dialectics aim to show the simple truth through or in the antitheses, falling back into pure logic. Analogy alone preserves the proper balance in and beyond this tension.

Section 6 links the analogy of being with the principle of non-contradiction (PNC). The two preceding extremes must be transcended. First, pure logic treats the PNC as a form of the principle of identity (PI), conceiving all as rest (essence), thus confusing creaturely with divine being. Second, pure dialectic, conceiving all as in flux (existence), presupposes and battles against the first extreme. The genuine PNC is a "dynamic middle", "not something fixed" (206), for philosophy has the creature as object. The actual creature is a middle between pure dynamis (limitless possibility, a coincidence of opposite possibilities) and pure actuality, which is the telos of present actuality. Interestingly, Przywara provisionally portrays dynamis as a somewhat causal and fecund infinity, even while already acknowledging the need for an actual mover (see, e.g., 208f). Because the creature is always on the way, the PI -- which for Przywara involves total self-identity -- is its goal, but the PNC expresses its actuality as an enacted possibility yet underway. Hence, there is a dynamic analogy between the PNC and the PI.

Przywara returns to the actual mover: The creature's underway actuality points towards an unmoved mover. Yet, this latter must, if we conceive it correctly, not be related to the creature. Whereas the creature moves toward God and necessarily depends on him, God neither depends on nor necessarily creates any creature. Nor is the realm of pure possibility autonomous from God but exhibits what lies within God's power. While God is "in" the creature, Przywara stresses his being "beyond." Thus, radically in flux and without foundation, the creature is simply in its relation to God; it is a middle suspended between God and nothing. Przywara even describes the creature as the "nothing" in relation to the Is of God. In each moment the creature is utterly "provisional," ever dependent on the divine decision, just as the creature's natural appetite finds no rest except in the order of grace. In sum, the dynamic movement of metaphysics involves continual self-transcendence, just as the creature itself, drawn by grace, is in a process of continual self-transcendence whose terminus is the beatific vision, which also never involves "comprehension" but rather entrance into the always infinitely greater divine mystery itself. Thus, Przywara renders the Lateran IV definition in a dynamic mode, seeing an implicit "ever" in the council's "greater". The superhistorical achievement of Section 6 is then worked out historically in Section 7 through a lengthy study of analogy from Plato and Aristotle to Augustine and Aquinas.

From a Thomistic and hence particular tradition, certain critical points can be suggested in remote service towards a fraternal but rival discussion of divergent traditions. First, a consideration that is "incomplete" need not be provisional or inconclusive. One truly judges "God is person" even without Trinitarian faith (ST Ia, q. 29, art. 1; IIIa, q. 3, art 3). Can there not be an endeavor of reason that is not merely not false but also certain regarding some things of substance? Second, it is not the case, pace Przywara (168, n. 33), that the fathers of Vatican I held creation ex nihilo to be alien to philosophy; they did not decide the question (L. Puntel). Third, the formula "essence in-and-beyond existence" naturally links, despite Przywara's deep appreciation of being's mystery, existence with "facticity" and essence (a limit principle) with fecundity. This conception seems backwards and indicates a notable instance of Przywara's freedom from, yet lexical dependence on, the Thomistic tradition. Something similar may be said of his description of dynamis.

Fourth, some Thomists might argue that Przywara's favoring a primarily (albeit not solely) meta-noetic methodology and his charge that Aristotle's inductions smack of the a priori are mistaken. Are not genuine abstraction and genuine induction, even if rare and basic -- yielding concepts such as substance, change, form, animal -- possible? If so, these can ground knowledge of first principles not dependent on hypothesis. Przywara contends otherwise: "Principles or truth . . . can in no way be inferred from experience or history" (175). Nor does Thomism study merely "universals"; both the origin of knowledge and the culmination of judgment is the real, and what is real are hypostases.

Fifth, Przywara attractively portrays "reduction into mystery" but thereby misconstrues the place Thomas gives to the via negativa. Thomas always held that truths about God could be known; his thought on quidditative knowledge of God even develops in favor of this claim (John Wippel). Thomas maintains the concept's ongoing role and connects God's transcendence not with conceptual faltering but with the structure of proportionality. Again, Przywara holds that all affirmations are "merely the basis" (231) for negations, calling on Thomas. However, Thomas contends that genuine affirmation underlies every meaningful negation. "God is not corporeal" makes sense only with reference to the foundation "God is." Thomas's thought culminates not in a via negativa but in a via eminentia. Perhaps what Thomas intends to express through proportionality, which sets no limit to transcendence yet retains the analogical connection founded in the act of the creature which is of course bestowed by God, Przywara seeks by reducing analogy (taken from the side of the creature) to the sheer relation of the creature to God as Wholly Other.

Consequently, sixth, Thomas considers possible a materially philosophical treatment of the being and attributes of God, one whose ground is the metaphysics whose formal object is being qua being. The certain findings of such a science could only wrongly be said to constrict the living God. Przywara's notion of natural theology seems rather slim by comparison; nor does Przywara consistently differentiate philosophy and theology by clearly defined formal objects.

Seventh, Przywara fails to distinguish proper from improper analogy, a distinction that divides analogy of proportionality. In proper analogy, the entire definition of the term applies to both subjects. The "greater difference" is noted not by reduction to metaphor but by appreciation of proportionality. Whereas the definition of "good" applies to God, that of "lion" does not because its perfection signified (res significata) includes defect. Clearly, this distinction is indispensible for scientific discourse.

Eighth, in defending a real similitude of creature to God in the face of serious 20th century opposition, Przywara may not have gone far enough. Relation presupposes its foundation in substance and act. If no foundation, no relation. The reduction of the foundation to the relation implicitly annihilates the contingent whose contingency, and reality, Przywara obviously intends to uphold. Such a hollowing out naturally goes hand in hand with a conception of rational nature as not possibly coordinated with any debita naturae. But if God would create only wisely, then if the creature is to exist (by God's free mercy), then certain other things -- debita naturae -- must also exist. Przywara's seems to be a conception of rational nature void of debita naturae.

This work will demand great attention for much time. Przywara's dialectical expositions are as fascinating and insightful as they are puzzling. His ultimate aim is prudently guided. Whether he has carved out a new mode of inquiry capable of subsuming past contradictions into a higher synthesis remains a question to be determined through ongoing debate between rival traditions. Whether the intricately laid, moving tapestry of his thought can be utilized without considerable cumbersomeness on the one hand or simplistic slogans on the other hand is yet another. In this regard, the excellent Introduction will prove necessary reading. A detailed table of contents, in the manner that appears in the 1962 German edition published by Balthasar, would be desirable.