Analytic Philosophy: An Interpretive History

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Aaron Preston (ed.), Analytic Philosophy: An Interpretive History, Routledge, 2017, viii + 287 pp., $ 49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781138800793


Reviewed by Johannes L. Brandl, University of Salzburg


As an increasing number of monographs, handbooks, and collections on the subject matter testify, the study of the history of analytic philosophy is in full swing.[1] This volume is a valuable addition to this growing literature, with a lucid introduction by the editor and seventeen contributions by distinguished scholars, all of which demonstrate a high quality in content and are written in excellent prose.[2] Although each chapter has its own agenda, a common theme runs through the book. The authors combat a narrow-minded, but still popular, conception of analytic philosophy based on a simplistic interpretation of the revolt against idealism, the linguistic turn, and the neo-positivist rejection of metaphysics. Such single-track explanations of the origin and nature of analytic philosophy do not withstand closer historical scrutiny. This is the central message that the present collection wants to get across.


The contentious claim is not just that analytic philosophy became more and more pluralistic (which would be hardly contentious at all); the claim is that it was never a unified movement. Against this "illusion of unity" (p.4), the present volume accumulates an abundance of evidence, some of which may be listed here as exemplary: Peter Hylton shows that Moore's and Russell's revolt against idealism had very little to do with Frege's defense of realism, which was a response to naturalism and psychologism in German philosophy at this time (p. 22). Scott Soames describes the turn to language as a historical process during which different conceptions of language emerged, starting from the idea of language as an "all-purpose tool for doing traditional philosophy" (p. 36) and culminating in the interdisciplinary project of a "science of language and information" (p. 42). With respect to metaphysics, several contributors remark that there is plenty of evidence that analytic philosophers tried to keep alive "a speculative interest in the universe" (Rosalind Carey, p. 98), and to retain the traditional separation of science and metaphysics (Hylton, p. 29). In a similar vein, Anat Biletzki asks how we can countenance the fact that Wittgenstein's Tractatus was clearly a metaphysical tract, but also "the anti-metaphysical bible" for the Vienna Circle (p. 106). Apparent inconsistencies like this are discussed throughout the collection and call for a comparison of different interpretations of the classical works of analytic philosophy. They also suggest putting these interpretations in a historical context and thereby urge us not to regard a given work as a "one-hit wonder: clever, snappy, danceable but ultimately just a thing of a particular moment", as Kelly Dean Jolley remarks with regard to Austin's Sense and Sensibilia (p. 237).


I can see two possible merits in such an approach to the history of analytic philosophy. One merit would be that it offers "a more fully formed and philosophically satisfying portrait of analytic philosophy", as the blurb on the back cover announces. When considered from this perspective, the collection is only partially successful. It is simply not comprehensive enough and is too selective in its choice of topics to achieve this goal. It limits itself exclusively to theoretical philosophy. Even in this domain some major figures are mentioned only in passing (or not mentioned at all), such as Frege, Carnap, Schlick, Tarski, Sellars, Chisholm, Lewis, Armstrong, Kripke, or Putnam. Moreover, no attempt is made to include developments within recent decades and thus to draw a portrait of analytic philosophy as it presents itself today.


Considered from another perspective, the volume appears much more satisfying and successful. It invites one to reconsider the debate between "ideal language philosophy (ILP)" and "ordinary language philosophy (OLP)", and the role it played in separating the analytic and the continental tradition in 20th century philosophy. Most of the contributions have something illuminating to say on this topic. Instead of quibbling about some shortcomings of this volume, I want to consider some of the insights to be gained on the issues that are most successfully treated in it.[3]


When Preston emphasizes the historical significance of "tradition shaping interpretations" (p. 1), he is belaboring the obvious. Who would deny that interpretations play a formative role in constituting a tradition, be it in philosophy, literature, or music? No cultural tradition is merely a string of canonical works, since without interpretations there would be no canon in the first place. Preston therefore toys with the stronger claim that interpretations -- which have often been misinterpretations -- created analytic philosophy in the first place (p. 4). This claim implies, as he notes, that analytic philosophy could again disappear by a radical change of interpretation: it could be "interpreted out of existence" (p. 17). I concur with Hanjo Glock that in pressing this view Preston overstates his case (p. 214). It is neither necessary nor very plausible to claim that analytic philosophy is a mere product of interpretations or misinterpretations.


Fortunately, there is a more mundane reason why interpretations matter in the history of analytic philosophy. What strikes me as important in this regard is the fact that much work in analytic philosophy consists of arguing against other views by presenting arguments intended to show what exactly is wrong with them. To achieve this goal one must make explicit what the other view consists in and where its weaknesses are to be found. This was the goal of Moore and Russell when they attacked idealism, the goal of Wittgenstein when he drew limits around what can be sensibly said, and the goal of those, like Ramsey, who attacked logical analysis from within (see p. 131). The same thing can be said about Ryle, Austin, and Strawson, when they rejected certain philosophical conceptions because of their disregard for the proper use of words. One might object that this is nothing special about the analytic tradition. But there is a noteworthy difference: the analytic ambition has always been to expose, in a self-critical manner, mistakes that one may be liable to make oneself. This attitude seems to be lacking in the skirmishes between Hegelians and neo-Kantians in Germany and England at the present time.[4]


Thus, there seems to be a common principle that unites analytic philosophers after all. Why then insist that analytic philosophy was pluralistic from the start? It is in light of this question that revisiting the debate between ILP and OLP can be fruitful. As many contributions in the volume make clear, interesting future projects may emerge from such reconsideration. Getting a better view of the ILP-OLP debate should remain a crucial part of the communal self-criticism that characterizes analytic philosophy.


It is therefore well-taken that Glock starts his essay on Strawson by reminding us that both of the labels "ordinary language" and "ideal language" are in need of further explanation (pp. 215ff). "Ordinary" is meant to contrast with "non-standard" and not with "technical". What distinguishes advocates of ILP is not just the use of formal languages, but their interest in scientific philosophy. While such an interest can also be found in American naturalists, neo-Kantians, or in Husserl's Logical Investigations, ILP promotes a further goal: to align philosophy with the sciences on a methodological level. Advocates of OLP do not share this goal. This does not mean, however, that they naïvely declare common sense or ordinary language to be the final arbiter of truth. Their idea is that a well-established linguistic practice is necessary for justifying claims and concepts that are less well understood.


Both sides in this debate get their fair hearing in the volume, which strikes a good balance between seven chapters dealing with ILP-related authors and themes (Russell, Wittgenstein's Tractatus, Ramsey, Logical Positivism, Nagel, Quine, and Davidson) and seven dealing with OLP-related authors and themes (Moore, the later Wittgenstein, Ryle, Strawson, Austin, and Dummett). The remaining papers relate to the ILP and OLP debate by either taking up issues of unity and fragmentation within analytic philosophy, or by reconsidering the parting of the ways between analytic and continental philosophy.


Perhaps the most rewarding approach to this debate is to trace the cross-fertilizations that occurred at various stages. In her essay on Moore, Consuelo Preti highlights a point that shows why Moore's way of thinking was equally adaptable to an OLP or an ILP approach: Moore was primarily concerned with the clarification of propositions, not of sentences (p. 76). Language for him was a necessary tool for carrying out conceptual analysis, not the object of analysis, and so different languages might be used for achieving this goal.


Ramsey provides another example of cross-fertilization in the opposite direction, as Cheryl Misak shows in her essay. She argues that Ramsey never shared the narrow view that formal languages can serve philosophy as a better tool for representing reality. Influenced by Peirce, he explored the linkage of belief, action, and truth (p. 138). This of course does not imply that Ramsey left the ILP camp, but it helps to explain why he could have had such a strong influence on Wittgenstein's later philosophy and thus indirectly on the OLP movement.


A third, and particularly interesting, case of cross-fertilization is the topic of Michael Kremer's essay, in which he explores the mutual influences between Ayer and his teacher Ryle. On the basis of some remarks in Ayer's autobiography, Kremer concludes that Ayer must have had access to an early draft of Ryle's Concept of Mind that is now lost (p. 180). There he might have found a version of behaviorism that fit his own logical positivism, and so Ayer combined these views in his inaugural lecture on Thinking and Meaning (1947). The lecture had an impressive reception but also earned some severe criticism from, amongst others, A. C. Ewing, H. H. Price, and A. D. Woozley. Kremer persuasively argues that this criticism left its traces in Ryle's final version of Concept of Mind, where Ryle considerably softens his behaviorism and moves towards a person-centred theory of mind, much like the position later advocated by Strawson (p. 176).


The general lesson to draw from these examples seems clear: analytic philosophy is both more fragmented and more uniform than the folklore conception allows. There is one domain in which this lesson is particularly relevant: metaphysics. The popular view is that the attitude of analytic philosophy towards metaphysics was originally mostly hostile, until a sea-change occurred in the 1970's that put metaphysics back on the agenda. Thematically, if not methodologically, analytic philosophy thus moved closer to continental philosophy. What do the authors in the volume say about this narrative?


Several contributors provide evidence against this view by pointing out that it was only the logical positivist camp that criticized speculative metaphysics for its lack of empirical foundations. As Rosalind Carey notes, Russell and Wittgenstein were both developing alternative philosophical systems with clearly metaphysical aspirations, using analysis to develop grand hypotheses (p. 91). Sean Morris makes a similar point about Quine, who retained his allegiance with naturalist and pragmatist views when he engaged with the views of Carnap and other positivists. His critique of Carnap's reductionism may therefore also be interpreted as a way of distancing himself from the Vienna Circle's anti-metaphysical stance. What Quine tried to achieve was not unlike Kant's attempt to "fold what remains of metaphysics firmly into a philosophy that is continuous with natural science" (p. 208).


Alan Richardson takes a further step when he suggests that Quine's naturalism may serve as a model of what he calls a "broad-tent" analytic philosophy (p. 157). Quine's view of the continuity of philosophy with science is loose enough "that both technical projects like Carnap's and 'common sense' projects like Austin's or Strawson's have a place" in it. (p. 157). Does this mean that the "deep fragmentation" generated by the ILP-OLP debate is slowly disappearing? Not really, because as Richardson notes "the typical analytic metaphysician of the 1970s . . . did not feel compelled to check the extravagancies of their philosophical universes against common sense" (p. 156).


If we think of analytic philosophy in this fragmented form, how should we conceive of its relation to the continental tradition? The question is explicitly taken up in the essay by James Chase and Jack Reynolds, who recognize that analytic philosophy was not only influenced by American naturalism and pragmatism, but also by the Austrian tradition, with Bolzano and Brentano as two major sources for Husserl's phenomenology (p. 54). No doubt, ILP and OLP provided different filters for interacting with this tradition. Hence, one cannot expect a single answer to the question why the analytic and the continental tradition parted ways and why their interaction was less fruitful than it could have been. And there are reasons for both optimism and pessimism concerning the possibility of re-establishing a common ground between these traditions. Chase and Reynolds opt for a rather optimistic interpretation. They discern within analytic philosophy an "inchoately perceived proximity with phenomenology" (p. 60). Referring mostly to Ryle and the OLP tradition, they observe this proximity not so much to Husserl's Logical Investigations, but to his later transcendental idealism, calling into doubt the alleged commitment to realism within analytic philosophy.


In her essay on Dummett, Anat Matar tries to make a case for an even more ambitious rapprochement between analytic and continental philosophy. She draws a connection between Dummett's anti-realism and the hostility towards realism that one finds in the work of Collingwood (p. 264). She also suggests that an illuminating connection exists between Collingwood's notion of the historicity of all meaning-constituting practices and Frege's non-psychological version of idealism. That drawing such connections can shed new light on Frege's context principle -- the principle stating that the meaning of a word requires the context of a sentence -- seems unlikely to me, even if it may "uncover some Hegelian traits buried in the analytic canon" (p. 256).


Such "big thinking" will not be to everyone's taste. Let me therefore hasten to add that the present collection also contains recommendations on a smaller scale. Cheryl Misak recommends that philosophers continue the work of Ramsey that ended so prematurely with his early death (p. 143). Duncan Richter hopes that the work of the late Wittgenstein will receive more attention after the current phase of "theory building and science emulation" in philosophy fades (p. 128). And Christopher Pincock finds much to recommend in Nagel's contextual naturalism since "it does not collapse into what is now known as reductive physicalism" (p. 170).


Yet, the most important recommendation may be found in Lee Braver's provocative essay on Davidson. He reminds us that philosophy sometimes becomes dogmatic in unforeseeable ways, and therefore recommends that we view Davidson's principle of charity as possibly a source of dogmatism that prevents us from understanding alien views (p. 247). Reading his paper, I felt drawn to the idea that what characterizes analytic philosophy more than anything else is its ability for self-criticism. Thus, I would happily endorse Preston's urging us to look out for new interpretations, hoping that analytic philosophy can thereby recognize its diversity and richness, while not giving up on its identity as a tradition.



Beaney, Michael. The Analytic Turn: Analysis in Early Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology. Routledge, 2007.


--  --  -- . The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophy. Oxford University

Press, 2013.


Dainton, Barry, and Howard Robinson, eds. The Bloomsbury Companion to Analytic Philosophy. Bloomsbury, 2014.


Glock, Hans-Johann. What Is Analytic Philosophy? Cambridge University Press, 2008.


Lapointe, Sandra, and Christopher Pincock. Innovations in the History of Analytical Philosophy. Palgrave-Macmillan, 2017 (forthcoming).


Preston, Aaron. Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion. Continuum, 2010.


Reck, Erich H. The Historical Turn in Analytic Philosophy. Palgrave-Macmillan, 2013.


Reynolds, Jack, and James Chase. Analytic Versus Continental: Arguments on the Methods and Value of Philosophy, Stocksfield, UK: Acumen Publishing 2010.


Schwartz, Stephen P. A Brief History of Analytic Philosophy: From Russell to Rawls. John Wiley and Sons, 2012.


Soames, Scott. The Analytic Tradition in Philosophy, Volume 1: The Founding Giants. Princeton University Press, 2014.


Textor, Markus. The Austrian Contribution to Analytic Philosophy. Routledge, 2006.


van der Schaar, Maria. G.F. Stout and the Psychological Origins of Analytic Philosophy. Palgrave McMillan, 2013.


White, Morton Gabriel. The Age of Analysis. Books for Libraries Press, 1955.

[1] See the list of references for some of the works published in the last ten years. 

[2] The authors (in the order of appearance) are: Peter Hylton, Scott Soames, James Chase and Jack Reynolds, Consuelo Preti, Rosalind Carey, Anat Biletzki, Duncan Richter, Cheryl Misak, Alan Richardson, Christopher Pincock, Michael Kremer, Sean Morris, Hans-Johann Glock, Kelly Dean Jolley, Lee Braver, Anat Matar, and Sandra Lapointe.

[3] Still, some minor shortcomings of the book have to be mentioned. The index is very sparse, containing no reference to authors mentioned only once or twice, e.g. to Anscombe, Black, Bolzano, Brandom, Brentano, Church, Dennett, Feigl, Grice, Kripke, C.I. Lewis, Peirce, Putnam, Rorty, Sellars, Stebbing, Warnock, and Wisdom. No biographical information about the authors in this volume is given, and there are some awkward typos like “Dennet” (twice on 10), “Russelian” (p. 12), and ‘Han’ (p. 38).

[4] I am not claiming that this is the only relevant difference between these debates, and I am aware of the fact that the critique of Hegel proceeded quite differently in England and Germany, as Morton White already pointed out (1955).