Analytic Philosophy and Human Life

Nagel Philo And Human Life

Thomas Nagel, Analytic Philosophy and Human Life, Oxford University Press, 2023, 291pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780197681671.

Reviewed by A.W. Moore, University of Oxford


This is a review of a book that itself consists mostly of reviews, between them covering a vast philosophical terrain. In writing it I have therefore had little choice, if not to adopt a view from nowhere, then at least to adopt a bird’s eye view. There are several major recurring themes in the book that are clearly visible from up there. In due course I shall focus on what I take to be the most prominent of these. But first I want to give some indication of the book’s scope and of why it is so engaging.

The reviews are divided into four parts. The titles of these four parts—‘Life and Death’, ‘Ethics’, ‘Moral Psychology’, and ‘Reality’—themselves bear witness to its scope. They are preceded by an overview, which is the Sintesi Panoramica that Thomas Nagel presented when he was awarded the Balzan Prize for Moral Philosophy, and succeeded by some moving tributes to people who were in many cases dear friends of Nagel’s and whose loss he obviously feels keenly—for philosophical as well as for personal reasons. Many of them are also authors of work reviewed earlier in the book.

Nagel’s most familiar and most fundamental commitments are discernible throughout: his insistence that we must acknowledge not only the genuineness and the inexhaustibility of philosophical problems, but also their profound difficulty; his anti-scientism; his Kantian commitment to morality (which is to be distinguished from a commitment to Kantian morality); his belief that we acquire mathematical and moral knowledge by reflective equilibrium; and, above all, his conviction, which I take to be the source of the major recurring theme of the book to which I have already adverted, that in ethics, metaphysics, and philosophy more generally we must always seek to do justice both to the subjective and to the objective. The familiarity of all of these from elsewhere in Nagel’s work makes their appearance in this context hardly surprising. Any sense of déjà vu is nevertheless mitigated by the distinctive force, clarity, and elegance that the review format brings to his expression of them.

Before I address Nagel’s concern with subjectivity and objectivity, I want to mention just a few of the many incidental delights that the book affords.

In the closing paragraph of his review of Christine Korsgaard’s Fellow Creatures Nagel notes, somewhat hyperbolically perhaps, that ‘[w]hether we should kill animals for food is one of the deepest disagreements of our time’ (95). But he immediately goes on to say that ‘we should not be surprised if the issue is rendered moot within the next few decades’, conjecturing that ‘when cultured meat [. . .] becomes less expensive to produce than meat from slaughtered animals, and equally palatable [. . .,] our present practices, being no longer gastronomically necessary, will suddenly become morally unimaginable’. It is an intriguing conjecture.

In the closing two paragraphs of his review of R. Jay Wallace’s The View From Here, Nagel outlines what Wallace suggests is the grain of truth in Nietzsche’s doctrine of the eternal recurrence, namely that (in Wallace’s words, quoted by Nagel) ‘[o]nly if we are prepared to will the totality of world history can we honestly adopt an attitude of unconditional affirmation towards our lives’ (104). This is a particularly striking thought for anyone such as me, who would not have existed had it not been for the Second World War. But Nagel recoils from the thought, which he describes as an ‘extravagance’. He urges that, whenever we affirm anything, our affirmation is limited by our temporal point of view to what is ‘downstream from’ a past that we can take as simply given. One of the many interesting features of Nagel’s recoil from this Nietzschean thought is the following irony: the acknowledgement that all affirmation is from some temporal point of view is precisely where Nietzsche himself locates the significance of his thought.

There is a delightful personal touch towards the end of Nagel’s review of the two recent books about Elizabeth Anscombe, Philippa Foot, Mary Midgley, and Iris Murdoch. ‘I found [these books] highly evocative,’ he writes, ‘since I knew two of the principals, Anscombe and Foot, extremely well [. . . .] I was present for some of the developments to which [Benjamin Lipscomb, the author of one of the books,] assigns the greatest importance’ (117–118). Then follows Nagel’s own fascinating sketch of both Anscombe and Foot. The closing sentence of the review expresses Nagel’s gratitude that he ‘was for a time a contemporary of these unforgettable women’ (120).

The fourth and final incidental delight that I want to single out is a delicious aside in Nagel’s review of Joshua Greene’s Moral Tribes. Nagel mentions Green’s proposal to rename utilitarianism ‘deep pragmatism’. He then adds, laconically and in parentheses, ‘lots of luck’ (169).

My main focus in this review, as I have already indicated, is on Nagel’s concern with subjectivity and objectivity. I have a worry about this which will be very familiar to Nagel, since it is shared by, and has been voiced by, many other people. It is the worry that there is, throughout Nagel’s work, an infelicitous oscillation between regarding subjectivity and objectivity as fundamentally features of reality and regarding them as fundamentally features of our representations of reality. My own view is that they are best regarded in the latter way. This does not preclude our regarding them as features of reality too, if only in some derivative sense. But it does mean that we have to be careful about doing so. We cannot just help ourselves to the thought that subjectively representing what is real is the same as, or can even be regarded as, representing what is subjectively real; nor indeed that objectively representing what is real is the same as, or can be regarded as, representing what is objectively real. If we are to think in these terms at all, then we have to be on our guard against attributing to reality what can coherently be attributed only to its depictions.

My worry is that Nagel is insufficiently sensitive to this point. And I think this lack of sensitivity manifests itself in two ways: first, in the way in which, when trying to impress upon us that some of what is real is subjective, he is concerned too much with what makes it subjective and too little with what makes it real; second, in the way in which, when trying to impress upon us that some of what is real is objective, he is concerned too much with what makes it real and too little with what makes it objective. (And incidentally there are grounds in each case for thinking that it is what he is concerned too little with that is more likely to exercise his intended audience.)

Let us begin with his attempts to impress upon us that some of what is real is subjective. In a summary of his own book Mind and Cosmos he insists that the physical sciences, despite their extraordinary success, leave an important aspect of nature unexplained, namely how things appear from the different points of view of different conscious beings. He concludes that the theory of evolution, if it is to fill this explanatory gap, must become more than a physical theory. Maybe. But there is no interesting sense in which it also follows, as Nagel claims it does, that evolution itself must be more than a physical process. Even if an explanatorily adequate account of how the world appears from the different points of view of different conscious beings must exhibit a kind of subjectivity that is foreign to the physical sciences, what is required for such subjectivity to count as a feature of reality is a further issue. Due attention to this latter issue is all too easily obstructed by undue attention to the former.

What then of Nagel’s attempts to impress upon us that some of what is real is objective? Here, in line with Barry Stroud—whose book Engagement and Metaphysical Dissatisfaction is the subject of another of Nagel’s reviews—he urges upon us the indispensability of certain ways of thinking. More specifically, he urges upon us the indispensability of these ways of thinking to our thinking about whether these very ways of thinking are answerable to something objective. Consider our causal thinking, for example. Stroud argues, and Nagel agrees, that when it comes to addressing the question of whether such thinking is answerable to something objective, we cannot help but adopt that very way of thinking: we cannot help but think causally. Stroud concludes that we cannot consistently answer the question negatively. Nagel is inclined to go further and conclude that we must answer it positively. But the most that follows is that some of our causal thinking is true, not that it is objective, still less that any of it is answerable to anything that is itself in any relevant sense objective.

We find the same dialectic concerning our modal thinking. Nagel writes, ‘[W]e can’t think at all without thinking that some things necessarily follow from or are inconsistent with other things. In particular, we can’t even argue for the conclusion that nothing really holds with necessity in the independent world, without depending on such logical reasoning. The arguments needed to arrive at [this conclusion] are inconsistent with [it]’ (224–225). But this suffers from the same problem. If the phrase ‘in the independent world’ is deleted, the remaining train of thought is admittedly compelling; but the most that it shows is that we cannot consistently deny the truth of some of our modal thinking, not that we cannot consistently deny its objectivity, still less that we cannot consistently deny its answerability to anything that is ‘in the independent world’. As it stands, with that phrase included, the train of thought involves a simple non sequitur.

A little earlier, and again in line with Stroud, Nagel proclaims that any account of necessity that denies its independence of us ‘fall[s] into the incoherence of asserting that necessary truths depend on something that might not have been the case’ (224). If he is right about that, then it certainly follows that we had better not subscribe to any such account, on pain of denying the necessity of necessary truths. But is he right about that? All that any such account need ‘fall into’, as Nagel puts it, is the perfectly reasonable, indeed undeniable, conclusion that our espousal of necessary truths depends on something that might not have been the case. The necessity of the truths themselves is uncompromised. (Suppose, by way of analogy, that there had never been any board games. Then we would not have had the rule that the bishop moves diagonally. Yet it remains the case that the bishop must move diagonally. That is the rule.)

These objections to Nagel’s views, as I have already intimated, will already be familiar to him—and, of course, in versions far less schematic than I have been able to proffer here. He has plenty to say in reply. Wherever the victory ultimately lies, there is much to be savoured in this entertaining and fascinating compendium of those views, which have done so much to shape the philosophical landscape over the past half century and for which he is justly renowned.