Analytic Philosophy and the Return of Hegelian Thought

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Paul Redding, Analytic Philosophy and the Return of Hegelian Thought, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 252pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521872720.

Reviewed by Willem A. deVries, University of New Hampshire


Analytic philosophy [AP] began, the stories tell us, in a reaction against "Hegelian thought," specifically, the neo-Hegelianism of late 19th century Britain.  Russell and Moore overthrew the doctrines of internal relations, of the falsehood of the partial and the truth only of the whole, and of the fundamentally spiritual nature of the world.  Most important, they brought into philosophy the new logic that had revolutionized a discipline that hadn't changed significantly since Aristotle invented it.  Russell (particularly) promulgated a 'shadow Hegel,' a distorted, even mythical image that justified his philosophical patricide, and he sold it effectively for the rest of his life.  After the Cambridge Two slew the Hegelian father and liberated philosophy from his oppressive regime, Hegel and Absolute Idealism became taboo, mentionable only with disgust, scorn, and ritualistic excoriation.  Though AP is regularly accused of being not just ahistorical, but anti-historical, there is an identifiable canon of historical philosophers that (most) analysts think it is profitable and good (though perhaps not necessary) to read and ponder.  Indeed, there has been some very good history of philosophy done by analytically trained scholars working on Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Kant, etc.  But Hegel is not in the canon, and is still widely stigmatized in analytic circles.  For the last 30 years (since Charles Taylor's 1975 Hegel), there has been talk of a rapprochement between AP and Hegelian thought.  But Hegel's entry into the Anglo-American canon made only halting progress.  In Analytic Philosophy and the Return of Hegelian Thought Paul Redding spells out the latest case for thinking that (at last) the barriers that put Hegel beyond the analytic pale are breaking down.

Internal influences within AP after WWII prepared the ground for a revival of interest in Hegel, most significantly the critique of the myth of the given and the arguments for semantic holism.  "Among the various figures of the generally post-positivist period of analytic philosophers after the Second World War, perhaps the one whose work promised some type of reconciliation with the idealist tradition from which Russell and Moore had broken was the American philosopher Wilfrid Sellars" (11).  The first resurgence of Hegelian thought within analytic philosophy had champions like Charles Taylor, Richard J. Bernstein, and Richard Rorty.  (Bernstein and Rorty had both been significantly influenced by Sellars.)  Its strength was demonstrating the relevance and cogency of Hegelian social thought.  But this first Hegel revival, according to Redding, still found Hegelian metaphysics indigestible, conceiving it still along Russellian lines as an ontological enterprise.

AP is now, in Redding's view, in a second and more thoroughgoing rapprochement with Hegel, again departing from groundwork done by Sellars and, indeed, radiating from a base in Pittsburgh.  Its principal protagonists are John McDowell and Robert Brandom, who each emphasizes different aspects of Hegel's philosophy.  Redding does not, however, believe that Pittsburgh neo-Hegelianism is the only form that a new and illuminating connection between AP and Hegelian thought can take.  His focus on followers of Sellars is apparently arbitrary, for a footnote claims he could do the same with Kripke.  One has to think, though, that the members of the Pittsburgh school make his job much easier by doing a good deal of the work of connecting to Hegel themselves.  The fans of Kripke and Lewis (either one) are hardly in a stampede towards Hegel.

Redding's discussions of the changes in AP that make it possible now to absorb and re-enact Hegelian modes of thought are rich and erudite, drawing on a wealth of knowledge in the history of philosophy, but there are two themes at the center of concern here.  The first is the notion of a given; the second is the primacy of propositional over term logic.  There are other leitmotifs that weave in and out of his discussions, such as the contrast between the Frege-Wittgenstein strand and the Russell-Moore strand of AP or the Fichtean/Hegelian conception of recognition as the ground of normativity.  But the ideas of the given and of the proper interpretation of fundamental logical notions form the thematic backbone of the book.  With regard to both of these themes Russell is the bogeyman:  his conception of acquaintance ensconced givenness at the very heart of both epistemology and metaphysics, and his Platonic conception of modern propositional and quantificational logic affected his reading of every philosopher and philosophical claim.  Once AP escapes from Russell's shadow, it can begin to reveal the real Hegel and appropriate his insights.

Chapters 1 and 2 are devoted, respectively, to McDowell and Brandom, demonstrating how each jumps off from a fundamental Sellarsian thesis and develops it in Hegelian ways beyond Sellars's original intent.  For McDowell, the central concern is the proper interpretation of the perceptual given.  For Brandom, it is the proper interpretation of the logical given.  These chapters set up the rest of the book by laying out the basic concerns of Pittsburgh neo-Hegelianism in both its avatars and raising the issues central to the rest of the book.  Chapters 3 and 4 are concerned principally with the correct interpretation of fundamental logical classifications and particles in German Idealism and modern neo-Hegelianism.  Chapters 5 and 6 focus on the logical grammar of evaluation, and chapters 7 and 8 confront the central stumbling block to the modern appropriation of Hegel:  his theory of the contradictoriness of things.

One recurrent theme is the proper treatment of the singular.  This has both logical and epistemological dimensions.  Epistemologically, it is clear that cognition must be able to relate to individual objects in one's immediate environment if it is to be at all useful.  But how are we to understand our cognitive relation to the singular?  In empiricism, this is one of the jobs given the given.  Here the classical logic of the scholastics generated problems that infected epistemology as well, for it was embarrassed by the singular.  Concepts are universals; they have instances.  A truly singular term is not a universal and not a concept.  Yet the constituents of judgments are concepts; judgments have no place for non-conceptual content.  The empiricists basically ignored the problem, for they took sensory experience to be singular yet sufficiently complex that concepts could be abstracted from it.  (Thus Sellars's criticism that empiricism's notion of the sensory is a "mongrel resulting from the crossbreeding of two ideas".)  Leibniz hoped to escape the embarrassment by treating singular terms as infinitely complex concepts, but Kant saw through that ruse and proclaimed that singular representations had to be of a different kind from concepts:  intuitions.  That still leaves the problem of how this new kind of singular representation enters into judgment.  Redding nicely explains how we have lost the distinction between the singular and the particular, and how the notion of particularity gets employed to bridge the gap that threatens to exclude the singular from judgment and cognition generally.  Sellars's suggestion that intuitions have the logical form of a 'this-such,' and that, effectively, the manifold of intuitions is a set of truly singular representations that, however, are available to consciousness only after having been massaged into the intuition of a manifold, something particular, belonging to a sort or kind, mobilizes Aristotelian themes to flesh out the thin resources of the new way of ideas.  McDowell mobilizes some of Sellars's insights (McDowell does not buy the Sellarsian analysis of the manifold of intuition as a plethora of singular, sensory representations), and Redding does a good job of relating the later McDowell's Kantian reflections to the work of the early McDowell (together with Gareth Evans) on demonstratives.  But McDowell, like Hegel, rejects the idea that there is an ultimate distinction in kind between intuition and concept even more radically than Sellars.  The conceptual realm, the "logical space of reasons" is unbounded, and the notion of non-conceptual content is a confusion.  Redding is not able to clarify McDowell's thought entirely to my satisfaction -- he repeats without much critical analysis McDowell's metaphor of a "sideways on" view of the world that naturalists are supposed to be (unfortunately for them) committed to -- but his treatment of McDowell is illuminating on many fronts.

The other major theme in the book is the proper interpretation of logical structure.  Russell grounded logical principles in our acquaintance with Platonic universals, a logical given.  This conception of logic can no more survive a critique of the "framework of givenness" than sense-data or appearance-based theories, and Sellars provided the fundamental insights for a better conception of the logical as well.  Sellars sketched an inferentialist and expressivist conception of logic that Robert Brandom has made more articulate and explicit in his work.  The content of a representation is determined by its contributions to acceptable inferences, both formal and material.  Logic formulates overtly the principles that are implicit in the norms governing our inferential behavior.  This approach does not attempt to reduce logic to a set of empirical generalizations describing our inferential behavior, for it explicitly acknowledges the normativity of such behavior.  But it does contain a strategy for avoiding the Scylla of the rationalist givenness of normative principles as well as the Charybdis of reductive naturalism:  "[T]he normativity of behavior will be bound up with its being treated by others in terms of its measuring up to or failing to measure up to common norms" (72).  The echoes of Hegel's notion of recognition are clear, but so are links to Davidson's notion of triangulation.  Brandom has made much of the analogues between his project and Hegel's, but Redding finds a problem with these claims:  Hegel's concept of determinate negation, which Brandom admits is Hegel's most fundamental conceptual tool, retains features of Aristotelian logic that have no simple equivalent in the Fregean logic Brandom endorses.  Brandom tries to cash determinate negation out in terms of material incompatibility, but this neglects, for instance, the fact that Aristotelian logic recognizes two different forms of negation.  Redding spends a fair amount of time discussing the ramifications of the fact that Aristotelian logic recognizes a distinction between negating a term (as in "A is non-B") and denying a term to a subject ("A is not B"), whereas Fregean-Russellian logic recognizes only sentence negation.  The point is not that one or the other is right, but that these two different systems express different aspects of our actual inferential norms, and both have a claim on our regard.  At least, according to Redding, that is what Hegel thought, for Redding finds in Hegel recognition of the appropriateness of these different logical forms to different forms of thought (or 'shapes of consciousness').  To understand Hegelian thought, therefore, one cannot attempt to force everything into the Procrustean bed of modern propositional or quantificational logic.

There is one more theme I'd like to discuss briefly:  evaluative judgment.  Normative assessment along the dimensions of the true, the good, and the beautiful is a central feature of human existence.  Redding's chapters on the perceptual discernment of value and the dynamics of evaluative reason are an extended meditation on what the grounding of normativity in the practices of socially interactive beings means for the applicability of evaluative concepts to particular instances and individuals.  Kant's treatment of aesthetic judgment forms the key transition to Hegelian thought here, but the implications reverberate in ethics and epistemology as well.  Indeed, they lead Redding finally to discuss Hegel's attitude towards contradiction.  For Hegel contradiction is the moving soul of the world; but what does that mean?  Here again, Redding's investigation into Aristotelian logic allows him to elaborate alternative readings of the 'law of non-contradiction' and argue that Hegel's cognitive contextualism gives him grounds to believe that there is no one 'law of non-contradiction' that could be affirmed or rejected as normative for all thought.

As is clear from my exposition here, a leitmotif throughout the book is how to incorporate rich and valuable Aristotelian insights into a modernist, post-Kantian mode of thought.  Though this is not a major focus for Brandom, Sellars and McDowell have both made substantial contributions to the contemporary interpretation of Aristotle and share with Hegel a profound respect for the peripatetic.  The book, while an essay on the return of Hegelian thought, is almost as much an essay on the return of Aristotelian thought that, while modernist, doesn't force it into the Procrustean bed of Principia Mathematica.

Redding's book is a tough read, but it is quite rewarding.  I marked many places where I had questions I would like to pursue further; I marked a few where I think Redding gets something wrong (an egregious misreading of Sellars on p. 84 stands out, because his reading of Sellars -- notoriously a difficult read himself (not much easier than Hegel) -- is normally very good).  I am also left wondering by Redding's final picture of Hegelian metaphysics as itself expressivist.  "[T]he structure of 'being' is that which shows itself within the logical structure of our sayings about particular 'beings', understanding 'logical structure' here as comprising those features of our sayings that mediate their inferential relations" (232).  On this view, "The absolute is to be thought of as something the structure of which is expressed or shown in the logic of our self-correcting attempts to talk about the world" (232).  The strongly teleological dimension of Hegel's conception of the Absolute does not seem to be done justice to in this characterization, unless we believe that the world exists in order for us to be able to talk about it.

One value in Redding's book that I endorse strongly is that both Hegel and AP are treated throughout with respect.  Redding is not arguing that the benighted members of the analytic school have, at long last, caught back up to Hegel, who knew everything all along; nor is he arguing that the tough, unintelligible nut Hegel presents to us can only now, with the help of people like McDowell and Brandom, be cracked.  This is a genuine attempt to fuse the horizons of two deeply related but historically separated traditions.  Will Hegelian thought make significant inroads in the enclaves of analysis outside the boundaries of the Allegheny and the Monongahela, or will Hegel continue to be the gaping hole in the canon of Anglo-American philosophy?  Only time will tell, but there is new hope with books like this.