Analytic Philosophy in America and other Historical and Contemporary Essays

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Scott Soames, Analytic Philosophy in America and other Historical and Contemporary Essays, Princeton University Press, 2014, 350pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691160726.

Reviewed by John Skorupski, University of St Andrews


The impressively solid and informative essays in this collection fall into three categories: the history of analytic philosophy, language and meaning, and the principles involved in judge-led interpretation of law. Given space limitations and my own competence I shall focus on the first two areas.

On language and meaning Soames' main focus is on the ideas of Kripke, and of others after him, about names and natural kind terms. Another concern is with the notion of a proposition, where Soames' take is Russellian rather than Fregean (though he develops a conception of propositions as cognitive acts that differs from Russell's -- see chapter 4, 'For Want of Cognitively Defined Propositions,' and elsewhere).

Chapter 7, 'Kripke on Epistemic and Metaphysical Possibility: Two Routes to the Necessary A Posteriori,' discusses Kripke's arguments for the existence of a posteriori necessities. One route goes through arguments for essentialism: i.e., the claim that there are properties such that objects necessarily have them if they have them. Such conditionals, if true, are true a priori, whereas the claim that an object or kind of object has such a property can be a posteriori. Soames distinguishes between this argument from essentialism and an argument from name-name identities (p. 176). According to the latter, the claim that Hesperus is Phosphorus is a posteriori, even though, self-identity being an essential property, it is also necessarily true. The question is how well the supposed a posteriori status of this proposition lies with Kripke's 'Millianism' about names.

Kripke argues that there is a possible world in which we see two different planets respectively in the morning and the evening but our epistemic situation is qualitatively indistinguishable from that which we are actually in -- or rather, that the ancients who lacked our current knowledge were in. In the epistemic situation the ancients were in it was epistemically possible (consistent with their evidence, though not metaphysically possible) that Hesperus was not Phosphorus, and so the improvements in knowledge that enabled us to discover that Hesperus is Phosphorus were improvements in evidence, that is, a posteriori.

This argument does seem to show that our knowledge that Hesperus is Phosphorus is a posteriori, even though what we know is necessarily true. However, Soames' version of it is somewhat more complicated, going through some meta-linguistic premises with which he finds fault (pp. 177-78). Kripke's 'Millian' semantics of names holds that their semantic contribution is determined directly by their reference, rather than indirectly by a conventionally assigned condition that an object has to satisfy to be the referent of the name. But now if we combine Millianism with the Russellian view of propositions ("Millian/Russellianism" -- p. 188) the claim that the proposition that Hesperus is Phosphorus is a posteriori becomes problematic, since it is the same proposition as the proposition that Hesperus is Hesperus, which (subject to the usual existence assumption) is a priori.

The issue is further pursued in ch. 11 ('Two Versions of Millianism') and 12 ('What are Natural Kinds?'). In ch. 11, Soames discusses Kit Fine's relationism. This starts from Millian/Russellianism but allows that 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' and 'Hesperus is not Phosphorus' do not express the same proposition, because the names 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' are not "co-ordinated." According to Soames, however, straightforward, non-relational, Millian/Russellianism is the semantic theory most in harmony with Kripke's "thoroughgoing antidescriptivism" (p. 188). I wasn't sure why. At any rate, as he also notes

To many, it seems pretheoretically obvious that one can believe the propositions semantically expressed by 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' and 'Hesperus isn't Phosphorus', without believing the propositions semantically expressed by 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' or 'Hesperus isn't Hesperus.' This creates a prima facie difficulty for non-relational Millianism -- to be dealt with by such extrasemantic factors as guises, ways of entertaining a proposition, pragmatic enrichment, the distinction between semantic and assertive content, the multiple assertion theory, and the least common denominator conception of meaning. (pp. 233-34)

I wouldn't want to go down these extrasemantic routes without first seriously examining whether Millianism really rules out the basic Fregean idea that a mode of presentation is always associated with a term (thus in effect rejecting the Russellianism as against the Millianism). To know the semantic contribution of 'Hesperus,' according to the direct account, is to know the relevant semantic clause for that term (as used in English), that is, to know that 'Hesperus' refers to Hesperus. To know the semantic clause for 'Phosphorus' is to know that 'Phosphorus' refers to Phosphorus. One can know both of these things without knowing that Hesperus is Phosphorus. The semantic clauses differ, and that already constitutes a difference in mode of presentation that produces a difference in semantic contribution. The same applies to Kripke's Paderewski example (in which someone fails to realise that Paderewski the musician is one and the same as Paderewski the politician). In this case the person in question thinks that the term 'Paderewski' as it occurs in the relevant semantic clauses in the metalanguage denotes different people (in Fine's terms the two occurrences are not co-ordinated). This person is in that respect misled about the meaning of the name, whereas in the 'Hesperus'/'Phosphorus' case there is no confusion about meaning, just ignorance of an identity. Or so a non-Russellian Millian could argue.

These questions conveniently lead to some larger, historical issues raised by these essays. Contrast the two Kripkean theses distinguished by Soames -- essentialism and Millianism about names. Essentialism is a traditional philosophical thesis; the significance of Kripke's revival of it is counter-revolutionary -- I shall come back to this in a moment. What, in contrast, is the philosophical significance of Millianism about names? The aim here is to find a good theoretical framework for empirical descriptions of particular languages. As with other empirical theories, there might be more than one that is best, with varying advantages and disadvantages, taking different lines about the semantics of names and sentences. It would undoubtedly be useful to philosophers to be able to draw, when convenient, on an accepted semantic framework, or some accepted choice of such frameworks. Nonetheless, Millianism is not philosophy in the sense in which essentialism is philosophy.

The fashion at the moment is to sniff at such demarcations. But they're not unimportant for a historian of philosophy. Soames sees analytic philosophy as a "discrete historical tradition stemming from Frege, Moore, Russell, Wittgenstein and the logical positivists" (p. 7). He has published an impressive two-volume work on Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century -- whereas the essays collected here were written for particular occasions. So I am not criticising when I note that no essay in the collection discusses the significance of the supposed 'tradition' as a whole, or indeed the idea that there is such a tradition. What we have is the title essay, and essays on Russell, Carnap, Quine, Lewis and Kripke. All these essays are very much worth reading. Still, if they are taken together, as perhaps they should not be, their effect is to give an impression that seems to me to be misleading. It is that 'analytic philosophy' is a continuous and continuing tradition whose core is a

grand project to which many analytic philosophers have devoted themselves -- moving the study of language, information and cognition from unsystematic philosophical speculation to a still future stage in which solid and comprehensive frameworks for genuine scientific investigation [of linguistic meaning] are in place. (p. 153)

Soames also quotes Russell's view, sympathetically I think: "philosophy is the way we approach problems that are presently too elusive to be investigated scientifically" (p. 56).

The overall impression, then, is of analytic philosophy as an activity centred on logic and language, which converts unsystematic philosophical speculation into rigorous linguistics. I'm afraid this strikes me as the kind of unhistorical, progressivist picture that committed practitioners like to tell about their own activities. A more historical picture, it seems to me, is that certain 'analytic' movements of the first half or so of the 20th century constituted a would-be revolution in philosophy -- as an aspect, one could add, of the more general modernist cultural revolution -- but that the second half of the century saw a counter-revolution against them.

Central to the initial revolution was the modernist idea that the supposed problems of philosophy could be dissolved by careful study of the uses or conventions of language. Call this the 'dissolution' view. It had a Carnapian wing and a Wittgenstein wing. (Russell had little sympathy for it, which made him an outlier, despite general respect for his work on the foundations of mathematics.) The two wings had very different 'feels', motives, and cultural implications; historically that is one of the most interesting things about them. Both of them, however, should be distinguished from the idea that philosophy is proto-science. The dissolution view gave the study of language an extraordinarily grandiose mission: the ending of philosophy. The proto-science view sees philosophers' study of language as a stage in the evolution of an empirical theory of language. The dissolution view would seek to show that essentialism is neither right nor wrong, but a dissoluble confusion. The proto-science view would find it hard to say anything about essentialism, but would treat philosophers' discussion of names as an early stage in the theoretical formation of empirical semantics.

One could of course endorse both views. As Carnap put it, "philosophy is to be replaced by the logic of science -- that is to say by the logical analysis of concepts and sentences of the sciences" (quoted at p. 55 and elsewhere). This is not what Wittgenstein had in mind. However, in this volume the emphasis is on the Carnapian project. Several excellent essays give a good account of it, and of its collapse. Fundamental to it, as Soames indicates, was the idea of analyticity: as on the one hand the product of conventions of language and on the other the source of aprioricity and necessity.

Quine's critique of Carnap's notion of analyticity, in particular of the notion of truth by convention, put paid to some of this. As Soames says, however, the assault was not complete so long as Quine still accepted verificationism (though at the level of theory as against sentence). With Lewis and Kripke, both pupils of Quine, the counter-revolution was complete.

So, at least on the Carnap-Quine-Lewis-Kripke side of the story, the 'revolution' against philosophy has been reversed. The idea that analysis of language would show philosophy to be a fundamentally confused activity has not prevailed. Has anything survived? In logic and set theory developments of permanent value were stimulated in part by a philosophical programme, logicism, that aimed to show mathematics to be a priori because analytic. It still has able defenders. But it is by no means current orthodoxy, not least because the ambitious notion of analyticity that it requires has lost support. The scene in philosophy of mathematics is highly pluralistic and diverse; in other areas of philosophy it is probably even more so.

This leads to a question: how useful for history of philosophy is the concept 'analytic philosophy'? The studies in this volume of early analytic movements and developments after them stand on their own terms and do not claim to answer such a question. But they tempt one to raise it. On the one hand the idea that study of language would show philosophy to be pseudo-problematic has long faded. On the other hand philosophy has always had room for the sensible idea that a systematic account of language can aid clarity and dispel mystification. This after all was the point of the substantial first book of Mill's System of Logic, 'Of Names and Propositions' -- in which he distinguishes between act and content of judgement, teaches that logic is concerned only with the latter, and gives a fairly systematic semantic theory of denotation and connotation, which includes the now familiar account of names as possessing the former but not the latter.

A philosophical approach that takes logico-semantic analysis seriously can differ from other approaches, for example, approaches that take phenomenology or historical hermeneutics more seriously. But this humdrum point is far from the heroic days of modernism, when 'linguistic philosophers' thought they could dissolve philosophical questions by scrutinising the nature of language. As to the label 'analytic philosophy,' it will no doubt survive so long as it is institutionally useful, even if it has no serious scholarly value. However, it introduces sectarian temptations. Philosophers should make use of whatever tools are appropriate to their particular problem -- analytic, phenomenological or hermeneutic -- without prejudice. Happily, that may be what is happening.

The analytic movements of the early 20th century remain fascinating not just for 'internalist' history of philosophy, but also for the intellectual history of that century. A kind of after-glow remains, in which the philosophy of language is thought to have a special foundational role for philosophy, even though its critical, anti-philosophical impetus has disappeared. Perhaps this after-glow still colours what we call 'analytic philosophy'. But (so at least it currently seems) the great dissolution of philosophy has in the end left the problems and practice of philosophy remarkably untouched.