Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion

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Aaron Preston, Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion, Continuum, 2007, 190pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826490034.

Reviewed by William Larkin, Southern Illinois University Edwardsville


Aaron Preston has written an extremely clear and richly provocative book on the nature of analytic philosophy (hereafter, AP). To provide a point of entry into his investigation, he initially characterizes AP as connected to a "particular philosophical outlook" that secured

the attention and the loyalty of academic philosophers both in places that mattered … and in numbers large enough to generate the kind of regular and widespread discussion that would both require the coining of a new term and explain that term's subsequent entrenchment as one of the most familiar in the philosophical lexicon. (2)

The philosophical outlook in question, Preston will argue, has been traditionally conceived of as centered on the linguistic thesis that "philosophy is wholly or largely a matter of linguistic analysis." (31) The primary aim of Analytic Philosophy: The History of an Illusion is to explain the "rather peculiar career" of AP as traditionally conceived; in particular, its rapid rise and fall and its continuing regional dominance. (3) Preston's main conclusion is that this peculiar career can be explained by the fact that AP was never a philosophical school defined by the linguistic thesis but a social movement that arose when scientism gave rise to a pair of illusions concerning the linguistic thesis. 

1. The Illusionist Thesis


Chapter two is concerned with establishing that there is a traditional conception of AP that has recently been found to be "hopelessly flawed." The traditional conception (TC) of AP, according to Preston, has both an intensional and an extensional aspect. On the extensional side, TC claims that AP has certain temporal, geographical, and biographical boundaries: AP originates around the turn of the twentieth century in Britain with the work of G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell and continues through the twentieth century primarily in English-speaking countries with the work of philosophers influenced by the likes of Wittgenstein, Ryle, Austin, and Quine. On the intensional side, TC claims that AP is unified by its adherence to some form of the linguistic thesis and the related ideas that AP is revolutionary, anti-metaphysical, and ahistorical.

To establish that there is a traditional conception of AP, Preston gathers together several "overt attempts to describe or define AP, the likes of which one would expect to find in anthologies and other introductory works." (35) For example he quotes Robert Ammerman in the introduction to an anthology in 1965 as saying 'philosophical analysis is essentially the study of language' and 'all analytic philosophers would agree that the study of language is of the greatest importance.' (35) Other statements are drawn from similar sources by Weitz in 1966 and Gross in 1970. Preston goes on to gather more statements about AP that line up with TC from non-introductory works by Corrado in 1975, Dummett in 1978 and 1993, and Sluga in 1980 and 1997. Then to establish that the traditional conception of AP is mistaken, Preston relies simply at this point on citing the work of Monk in 1997, Hacker in 1998, Hylton in 1998, and Beaney in 2003. (He will go into more detail on the inadequacy of TC in chapter five.)

It doesn't seem to me however that most of the statements Preston has chosen as expressing TC clearly do so. Ammerman says that philosophical analysis is essentially the study of language, but that does not say that all there is to philosophy is philosophical analysis.  To say that all analytic philosophers would agree that the study of language is of the greatest importance is pretty far from saying that they would all agree that there is really nothing more to philosophy than linguistic analysis. And as Preston points out, Ammerman, as well as "nearly every work on AP", adds some kind of disclaimer before his attempt to say something about analytic philosophy in general, something like "there is no single philosophy of analysis." (36) So it's not obvious to me that there was ever any kind of strong consensus that tried to really define analytic philosophy as essentially involving a commitment to the linguistic thesis.


TC claims that AP is by genus a philosophical school that is differentiated primarily by its commitment to the linguistic thesis. Preston claims that people have started to 'revise' the traditional conception in two ways. The genus revisionists claim that AP is just not the kind of thing that is defined by any unifying doctrines or methods, but rather a movement or tradition defined by a trail of influence. As examples of genus revisionism, he gathers statements by (among others) Baille in 1996, Glock in 1999, Stroll in 2000, and Soames in 2003. The differentia revisionists claim that AP is not unified by its commitment to the linguistic thesis but rather by some other view. As examples of differentia revisionism, Preston points to statements by (among others) Munitz in 1981, Cohen in 1986, and Charlton in 1991.

Chapter three aims to establish the ineliminability of TC by raising fundamental objections to both differentia and genus revisionism. Against differentia revisionism, Preston argues that the ordinary conception of AP was in fact the original conception. That is, the traditional conception of AP, with its use of the linguistic thesis as an essential differentia, has been around since the very coining of the term "analytic philosophy." To establish this, Preston looks at the earliest known uses of the term "analytic" as a name for a particular philosophical entity or a definite group of philosophers -- uses by Wisdom in 1931 and 1934, by R.G. Collingwood in 1933, and by W.P. Montague in 1933 -- and gathers statements that appear to connect 'analytic' philosophy essentially to linguistic analysis.

Again it is not clear to me however that these original claims about AP are really claiming that what is essential to AP is adherence to the linguistic thesis. It seems to me that a stronger candidate for the original conception of AP was one that claimed that analytic philosophers were unified in the view that philosophy does not aim at "new truths" but rather "new insight into old truths", as Wisdom is quoted as saying. (71) This could be taken rather narrowly, and was by some, as a recommendation to simply establish the meanings of certain key or problematic terms; but it could be also taken more widely as a recognition that the goal of philosophy is not so much new information as it is deeper understanding.

Against genus revisionism, Preston's strategy is to show that the very nature of philosophy itself implies that a philosophical group cannot be "characterized by the looseness and vagueness usually associated with 'movement' or 'tradition' … but must be characterized by the tightness and definiteness normally associated with 'school'." (61) Preston thinks that philosophy must be thought of as essentially concerned with the production of theories about the "way things are … in some region or other … of reality." (61) He then argues from this that "a philosophical group must rely for its cohesion, and hence also its existence, on a kind of unity that is constituted by agreement in theoretical matters." (62) And that kind of unity requires not just a loose relationship in virtue of a causal-historical chain of influence but a tight connection in terms of defining doctrines or specific methodology.

This argument against genus revisionism, however, relies on a view about the nature of philosophy that the analysts, under the original conception expressed by Wisdom and Collingwood, would reject. On that original conception, as I said, it looks like philosophy is not thought of as a theoretical enterprise -- the goal is not to achieve new knowledge of how things are, it is rather an attempt to achieve new insight into the picture of the world we already have (the manifest and scientific images, in Sellarsian terms).


The case for the illusionist thesis comes together at the beginning of chapter four. Chapter two is taken to have shown how the traditional conception of AP has been "false at every stage of its development" (80); while chapter three is taken to have shown that the traditional conception of AP is historically ineliminable. These results together, thinks Preston, force us to conclude that the traditional conception of AP is an illusion in the sense that AP was never in fact unified by a commitment to the linguistic thesis, or its concomitant anti-metaphysical and anti-historical stances, though it did in fact seem that way to those who proffered the original and the ordinary conceptions of AP. (81) Preston thinks that intimately connected to this primary illusion of unity is a second-order illusion of promise according to which the illusion of unity presents AP as an immensely promising movement by presenting it as unified around the immensely promising linguistic thesis. The remainder of the book tries to get at the root of these illusions and use them to explain the peculiar career of AP.

The illusionist thesis is crucially based in part on the claim that TC was "false at every stage" of AP's development, which I take to mean that there was never a time at which analytic philosophers were in fact unified around the linguistic thesis. But two of AP's stages -- the logical positivist stage and the early stage of ordinary language philosophy dominated by the later Wittgenstein -- can each be fairly characterized as unified around a version of the claim that the proper work of philosophy is linguistic analysis.

I would maintain that the linguistic thesis was used in something like a reference-fixing description at the baptism of "analytic philosophy" to help pick out a certain philosophical tradition as the referent of that name. When philosophers and historians of philosophy were coining the term "analytic philosophy" they were saying that it shall refer to the kind of work done by philosophers in the tradition of these philosophers (i.e., the positivists and followers of the later Wittgenstein that were salient figures at the time of the coining of 'analytic philosophy') who are unified by the linguistic thesis. To the extent that anyone then took adherence to the linguistic thesis as a defining characteristic of AP (and it is not clear to me that a great many people did this), they are simply guilty of confusing a reference-fixing description with a definition. This shift from illusion to confusion is important, I think, because it opens up the possibility that historians may yet discover some unifying feature of AP, one that is very far removed from the linguistic thesis perhaps, without this counting as anything like 'revisionism.'

2. The Scientistic Thesis

Scientism is the view that knowledge proper can only be achieved through the methods of modern science. The scientistic thesis is the view that scientism bears a systematic relation to AP. (124) Preston maintains a version of the scientistic thesis by claiming that scientism is at the root of both the illusions of unity and promise that are part of the nature of AP.


In the first half of chapter five, Preston convincingly argues that there were substantial disagreements about the aim of philosophy and the nature of philosophical analysis among AP's founding fathers -- Frege, Moore, and Russell -- and that each of these canonical analysts departed from the linguistic thesis by both denying that philosophy is to be defined by a single method of analysis and refusing to equate philosophical analysis with linguistic analysis. (99) In the second half of chapter five, Preston attempts to explain what caused people to overlook these substantial differences and these clear departures from the linguistic thesis.

Preston's claim is that scientism is at the root of the illusion of unity, because substantial theoretical disagreements are overlooked as the result of a pattern of emphasizing more readily 'observable' features of the practice and expression of philosophical analysis. The result, he claims, is virtually an exclusive focus on talk about 'sentences', 'statements', and 'linguistic equations', a focus which promotes the mistaken view that analysts were all primarily if not exclusively concerned with the analysis of language. This of course would give rise to the illusion that analysts were unified in their acceptance of the linguistic thesis. Such a pattern of emphasizing the more 'empirical' features of the form of analyses while de-emphasizing the more 'metaphysical' theoretical disagreements over the substantive nature of those analyses was, Preston argues, a manifestation of scientism's preference for empirical modes of thought.

I find this explanation from scientism for how (purportedly) so many could have overlooked the obvious theoretical disagreements between analysts to be incredible. For it seems to me that the illusion of unity would have required more than 'de-emphasizing' theoretical disagreements; it would require completely overlooking those disagreements. But then we would have to accept that when certain historians and philosophers were looking at the work of certain other philosophers they were so deeply under the spell of scientism that they failed to even see the more 'metaphysical' elements in their thought.


In chapter six, Preston argues that scientism is also at the root of the illusion of promise. There are three important elements to what is something of a complicated story here. The first story element concerns what Preston calls the paradigmatic turn, which involved AP turning away from the idea of philosophy as a "thing of reflection upon ultimate foundations" toward the idea of philosophy as a "thing of inquiry under paradigms and exemplars." (130) On Preston's view AP ceased to be a philosophical entity at all when it took this paradigmatic turn. For a philosophical group cannot operate under the presuppositions of any paradigm since by its nature philosophy seeks to be 'presuppositionless'. (129)

The second story element introduces the influence of Newtonian science. Scientism enters the story at this stage to determine that AP will look to empirical science for a model; and the empirical science that exerted the most influence on philosophers in Britain at the turn of the twentieth century was Newtonian physics. So at this point in the story philosophy is trying to model itself on Newtonian science; and at first it tries to do so, following Locke and Hume it would seem, by becoming a 'mental science.' (145)

Here is where the third story element -- the rise of experimental psychology -- comes in. Experimental psychology takes over as the mental science that can model itself much more closely on Newtonian science, and so philosophy has to look elsewhere to try to preserve itself as a genuine field of knowledge. It looked, Preston claims, to language and meaning and the work of Moore and Russell. Meaning had always been a concern to philosophy, so it was something AP could lay claim to; language had the advantage from a scientistic perspective of providing concrete objects to examine and empirically accessible data. The work of Moore and Russell showed how analyzing language could take on something closely approximating mathematical form.

According to this story, AP arises out of an attempt by certain philosophers in the early twentieth century to model philosophy on Newtonian science by focusing on linguistic analysis in the manner of Moore and Russell. Given the scientistic background and the rise of experimental psychology, a movement focused on more or less formal linguistic analysis would have appeared as extremely attractive if not essential for the survival of philosophy as a genuine knowledge discipline.

The story that Preston has told here has a certain degree of plausibility, but it does not seem to be much more than a plot sketch. What's lacking is character development. To make the story a plausible explanation, we would need to hear more about the specific philosophers between Moore/Russell who are supposed to have begun modeling philosophy on Newtonian science, including being given some specific evidence that they were particularly influenced by the three story elements described above. We also would need to hear more about the coining of the term 'analytic philosophy'.

3. Conclusion

In the first chapter, Preston argued that AP now faces a crisis that "calls for AP to clarify and to justify its nature and its methods once and for all." (27) The clear message by the final chapter is that AP will never be able to do that, and so AP is nothing more than an emperor without any clothes who really ought to step down in disgrace. Preston thinks that AP will never be able to clarify or justify its nature because its nature is (a) inextricably caught up with the linguistic thesis, but (b) the idea that analysts are or have ever been unified around the linguistic thesis is an illusion.

I have suggested that perhaps the traditional conception of AP as defined by the linguistic thesis involves not so much an illusion as a certain kind of confusion -- that no one ever really wanted to define AP by the linguistic thesis, though they did use the linguistic thesis as part of a reference fixing description. If this is right, there may yet be some underlying nature of AP that could be clarified and justified. I have also hinted that the defining feature of AP might be something like the idea that philosophy does not aim at knowledge of new facts so much as at a deeper understanding of 'old facts' -- propositions that we presuppose to be true and known. If this is right, then it may be inappropriate to require AP to try to justify its nature and methods in the first place. AP can be considered a philosophical tradition, and not thought of as a social movement, without having to have anything like a defining doctrine.

I have tried here simply to lay out the overall structure of Preston's case for the view that the peculiar career of AP is best explained by the influence of scientism and the fact that the traditional conception of AP is an illusion. I have been fairly critical of this overall structure, but I still find Preston's book of significant value. First, because it addresses head on some issues that need to be addressed -- the nature of AP and its relationship to science and the linguistic thesis. Second, because there is a great deal of value to be found in the details of the book that I have glossed over.