Analytical Essay on the Faculties of the Soul

Analytical Essay On The Faculties Of The Soul

Charles Bonnet, Analytical Essay on the Faculties of the Soul, Stephen Gaukroger (trans.), Oxford University Press, 2022, 234pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192846778.

Reviewed by John H. Zammito, Rice University


Who was Charles Bonnet, and why has this work been chosen for English translation? Bonnet (1720-1793) was a prominent Genevan thinker of the Enlightenment who first became famous in 1743 as an experimental naturalist disciple of Réaumur, working in entomological microscopy. Eye strain (and encountering Leibniz’s Theodicy) induced him to turn, in the 1750s, from experiment to “philosophical” meditations, resulting in a prolix 3000-page manuscript from which he generated several major publications over the next severalfew decades. Part of this manuscript, entitled “Essay on Psychology,” he presented to his peers in Geneva early in the decade, only to be accused of “materialism.” Indeed, 1745-1755 was the high tide of French materialism, associated with the Parisian Encyclopédie, with Julien Offray de La Mettrie, Claude-Adrien Helvétius, Paul Thiry Holbach, Denis Diderot, and even Comte de Buffon, occasioning great anxiety within the Genevan Christian community. Bonnet published the work anonymously in 1754, but by 1760 he came to believe it required a number of revisions, resulting in his new Analytical Essay on the Faculties of the Soul. Thus, for editor/translator Stephen Gaukroger, the key importance of the work is Bonnet’s rejection of ontological materialism and articulation of a “naturalistic account of mind” (viii) on methodological and empirical grounds, a physiological psychology congenial to the medicalization of the study of man (ix), which Gaukroger associates with the phrase “philosophical medicine” circulating at the time (xxxi). Not only did Bonnet avoid the reductionist and atheistic materialism of the Parisians, but he sought to use his science to defend Christian ideas “against the unbelievers,” as the title of a recently published collection of his correspondence with Joseph Needham has aptly phrased put it. (Mazzolini and Roe, eds., Oxford, 1986).  What distinguished Bonnet in his Enlightenment moment was his strong commitment both to Christianity and to a relentlessly empirical approach in science. 

The English translation is finely produced, with a deft rendering from the original French of Bonnet’s style of exposition, familiar to this reader from encounters with his other massive tomes in the original language. The apparatus is effective, and the bibliography, very helpful. Gaukroger’s introduction does a fine job of situating the work in context, especially in the line from Descartes to Locke, Étienne Bonnot de Condillac, and the development of sensationalist and associationist theory of mind. The parallel with David Hartley’s nearly contemporaneous Observations on Man (1749) becomes clear, but Gaukroger makes the point that there is no evidence that Bonnet was aware of Hartley (xvii, n15). In assessing the work, Gaukroger notes Bonnet’s frequent recurrence to his anonymous earlier work, observing that Bonnet “praises and criticizes [it], as though it was not by him” (18n).  There are also frequent efforts in the new text to distance its views from “materialism” (e.g., 37).  It might have been useful to contextualize this ideological enterprise a bit more, because in many quarters (especially in Germany), it was Bonnet’s “materialism” that preoccupied its reception, making all the more paradoxical his well-known advocacy of Christian religion. 

As psychology —a term Gaukroger suggests Bonnet introduced into French (see also Vidal, The Sciences of the Soul: The Early Modern Origins of Psychology, Chicago, 2011; original French, 2006)—the thrust of the work was to articulate “analysis” over against “metaphysics.” It was with this contrast that Bonnet sought to distinguish his work from the obvious and weighty precedent of Condillac’s Treatise of Sensations (1754), especially given the common recourse to what Gaukroger aptly terms “reverse engineering” (viii) in the metaphor of an inert statue come to life through sensations. Method was a central concern for Bonnet. “Analysis” was his by-word. By it he meant applying the “natural-history method of investigation” (7) to “philosophical” questions. “Psychology needs to study man just as the natural philosopher studies nature” (69).  “I have undertaken the study of man in the same way that I have pursued that of insects and plants” (7).  “I am searching for facts; I compare facts and try to shape them into results” (56) to model “the mechanics of our being” (69).  “All theory is only the experience of natural results that reflection can deduce from experience and observation” (137). Bonnet conceded, in the line of Locke, that metaphysically mind-body relations (“Union,” as he phrased it) had to remain an impenetrable “mystery” caught up with the inaccessibility of all “real essences.” Nevertheless, he insisted, “I at least know with certainty [!] that I only have ideas as a result of the motions that are excited in certain fibres of my brain.” (14). He proposed, accordingly, “an experimental and geometrical psychology” (34) which empirically assumed an interactionist dualism: “particular changes in the soul answer to particular changes in the brain” (37). That is, “it is always the soul that senses—this truth is incontestable—but it is always the body that makes it sense. . . We are not [just] our soul” (44). As Gaukroger emphasizes, what mattered was that “the soul . . . must inhabit a material structure of some kind in order to have sensory input” (xxix). Thus, the object of investigation was sensations, modifications of the soul “relative to our sense organs, our nervous physiology, and our brain physiology.” (xxiv). Bonnet was convinced there had to be a physical “seat of the soul,” probably in the brain, but where and what it was seemed less significant to him than how it had to work in association with the sensations and activity of the mind (soul). 

“We do not know the respective distribution or arrangement of the different orders of the fibres in each sense, and we are even less sure of their arrangement in the seat of the soul . . .Everything that we can understand about this subject can be reduced to this: the relation between our ideas, of all kinds, is assumed to be between the different orders of the fibres which are used to form them...” (39) 

Bonnet’s exhaustive (and exhausting) account of “fibres”—how they develop through nutrition and change in response to stimulation in the sense organs and in the brain—and of how these “bundles of fibres” presumably interacted among themselves and with the soul, forms the substance of his text as he builds his grand analogy of a senseless statue gradually introduced to one sensation of smell after another. Of course, knowledge of these physiological matters was still quite primitive in the eighteenth century, and Gaukroger concludes, not unjustly, “this is all very tenuous, and depends on analogies and completely hypothetical connections” (xxi). 

In the context of the statue analogy, Bonnet expounds how the soul gradually becomes aware and discriminating (for every sensation is associated with subjective pleasure or pain, memory identifies this association, and desire seeks to perpetuate the pleasurable states), until, ultimately, from sensations as “natural ideas” it forms artificial “signs”—language, concepts and judgments about the world beyond the mind. One of the consequences of this “natural-historical” investigation was that animals underwent much the same sensualist development, and therefore it seemed plausible that animals had souls very similar to humans, distinct only in their incapacity for reflective conceptualization. Here, the parallels and contrasts with German Schulphilosophie—Wolffian faculty psychology—become palpable, and there are good grounds to suspect influence from Bonnet on these formulations, especially among the more revisionist Wolffians, like Hermann Samuel Reimarus and G. F. Meier, on questions of the animal-human boundary and the contrast of instinct with understanding. 

The most famous chapter in the work, Chapter 24 (193-208), offered a remarkable analogy between Bonnet’s understanding of insect metamorphosis and preformationist embryology, on the one hand, and human immortality and the resurrection of the body in Christian religion, on the other. Bonnet begins with the question of the identity of the insect across the phases of metamorphosis: “. . . because the seat of the soul has not changed, it can remember some of the sensations of its first state . . . enough to connect the I of the butterfly to the I of the worm [i.e., caterpillar]...” (200-201). Thus, not only can we think of this as analogical in analogy with the passage of the human soul through death to immortality, but we can try to make sense of the Christian doctrine of the resurrection of the body. First, Bonnet argues, we must consider all the recent theories of “fine” or “ethereal” matter or forces, like electricity. While these are physical, they are virtually immaterial and not subject to the vicissitudes of coarser matter. This can, in turn, be compared to the theory of embryology, in which from incorruptible, pre-established “seeds”—too minute for the best microscopes to detect—develop into organized forms develop. In short, one could discern in “fine” or ethereal matter a physical concomitant of the soul. “If death is not the end of existence, if our souls must be united one day to another body, never to be separated from it, it is likely that this body already exists in miniature in that which we currently live” (201). That is, “the seat of the soul thus contains in miniature a human body” (204). It is fine matter “similar to that of fire or ether” (203). Hence, “it is possible that the seat of the soul presently contains the seeds of this incorruptible and glorious body of which revelations speaks” (204). “I believe therefore that it is by means of this ethereal machine that objects act on the soul, and that the soul acts on its body” (203). This was Bonnet’s most striking—and strikingly metaphysical—intervention in the thought of the eighteenth century, elaborated most famously in his Palingénésie philosophique (1769). Anglophone students of the Enlightenment should be grateful for Gaukroger’s translation. 


Vidal, Fernando, The Sciences of the Soul: The Early Modern Origins of Psychology, Saskia Brown (trans.), Chicago, (2011); original French, (2006).

Renato Giuseppe Mazzolini and Shirley A. Roe (eds.), Science Against the Unbelievers the Correspondence of Bonnet and Needham, 1760-1780, Oxford, (1986).