Analyzing Oppression

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Ann E. Cudd, Analyzing Oppression, Oxford University Press, 2006, 278pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780195187441.

Reviewed by Ruth Sample, The University of New Hampshire


This excellent book presents a clear, coherent, and eminently defensible reformative account of the notion of oppression. The aim, in the best analytic tradition, is to present an account that captures our basic intuitions about the nature of oppression while correcting those judgments that are distorted, based on false empirical information, or that are otherwise ill-formed. To this end a substantial amount of psychology, sociology, and economics is brought to bear in discussing the nature of the phenomenon to be defined. At the same time, the author insists that an adequate definition of oppression be one that in some way points in the direction of a solution to the problem. The definition of oppression, in other words, must be consistent with the possibility of ending it.

Throughout, the notion of oppression is understood as one that is relevant to social and political philosophers, viz., the oppression of social groups and their members. Other uses of the term (e.g., "I am oppressed by a heavy teaching load and family obligations" or "I can no longer bear this oppressive heat") are not the focus here. The idea is to suggest what social philosophers ought to mean when they use the term "oppression," rather than to merely document its various uses in various contexts.

The author very usefully begins by tracing out the genealogy of the term as it has developed since the early modern period. First as applied to personal violence and enslavement, then to political oppression of subjects by their rulers, oppression gradually came to take on a more social connotation. By the nineteenth century, oppression came to be seen as a less formal relationship between social groups. Tyranny of the majority, social mores and conventions that disadvantage certain groups with respect to others (as emphasized by John Stuart and Harriet Taylor Mill), a failure to recognize or respect certain groups, all came to be seen as forms of oppression. Finally, Marx and Engels came to see economic systems (combining both social mores such as individualism and legal regulations) as a site of oppression.

So what ought we mean when we use the term "oppression"? Any adequate definition, Cudd argues, must be clear and coherent, accurately picking out the right cases and only the right cases of oppression. It ought to be suitably general and should provide guidance for analyzing specific cases. Finally, she argues that any adequate account of oppression must "point in the direction of a resolution or a reduction of oppression" (Cudd, 21).

Ultimately, Cudd defines oppression as "the existence of unequal and unjust institutional constraints" (Cudd, 52). These constraints involve harm to at least one group on the basis of a social institution that redounds to the benefit of another social group. This harm comes about through coercion, or the use of unjustified force (Cudd, 25). Institutionally structured constraints include "legal rights, obligations and burdens, stereotypical expectations, wealth, income, social status, conventions, norms, and practices" (Cudd, 50).

This definition captures our intuitive idea that the modern-day use of oppression is an inherently social one, and that part of what is objectionable about it is that it involves worsening the position of one group to benefit another in some unfair way. A person can be a member of an oppressed group even if no specific member of the oppressor group can be pointed to as the oppressor. It also suggests, although it is not built into the definition, the weightiness of oppression: not only do institutions harm some groups, but also they can weigh them down so that they resist it only with great difficulty. This is something only institutions could do, because institutions have the persistence that individuals do not. People die, but oppressive institutions can live on and on.

All of this raises the further question of what makes a social group and how social groups become oppressive. Cudd persuasively argues that the constitution of social groups (groups of people that face the same or similar social constraints) is not simply voluntary, but is defined by the shared social constraints of a group's members. People cannot choose, for the most part, whether or not they are black or female or visibly disabled. Even if one does not want to be seen as black, one will run up against the reality of racial categories very quickly. Women who do not see themselves as members of a social group that is seen as a more appropriate target of rape and other forms of violence (and whose culture will not take a "zero tolerance" approach to sexualized violence) will quickly see that they cannot opt out of the social constraints placed on women. So being the member of a social group that happens to be oppressed -- or being a member of an oppressor group -- isn't really up to us, although how we respond to it may be.

More problematic is the actual typology of oppressed groups. For example, shorter people (and in particular, shorter men) are viewed as less competent and authoritative than are taller people. This is a social constraint; they are more likely to be bullied, are taken less seriously, and earn less money than do their taller counterparts. Are they oppressed by the tall? Similarly for those who in any way do not fit in and therefore pay a social penalty. Cudd dismisses this problem by arguing that while there are many nonvoluntary social groups, there are not "indefinitely many" and that only the groups that face social consequences count as true social groups (Cudd, 50). Although it may be true that there are not indefinitely many social groups, there are very many groups that would count as oppressed. In addition, some members of oppressed groups (shorter men, for example) would also be members of oppressor groups (men in general, or white men more specifically). This may seem to lead to the conclusion that virtually everyone is a member of an oppressed group or an oppressor group and that most people are members of both kinds of groups. In other words, nearly everyone is oppressed and nearly every one is the member of an oppressor group.

However, emphasizing this consequence diverts attention from the merits of Cudd's definition, because her definition does not lead to the conclusion that everyone is equally oppressed. Because harm is central to the idea of oppression here, we can in principle rank forms of oppression in terms of both their harm and the pervasiveness of their harm. Cudd's analysis is not preoccupied with pointing fingers or claiming victimhood -- although she has a very useful chapter on taking responsibility for oppression. Instead, she emphasizes institutional structures that allow one group to benefit from social constraints on another -- even when some of the many members of the benefiting group did not create the social constraints initially, and even when they do not strategize to gain benefit. She also points out that it is possible to be part of an oppressor group -- including an oppressor group that benefits from very serious harm to an oppressed group -- and to not even know that one is a member.

Who are the oppressed? What are the paradigmatic cases of oppression? Slavery, both ancient and modern, counts as oppressive, as does colonialism. On Cudd's view (and, as she notes, that of Marx and Engels), the oppression of women by men is possibly the oldest and the most persistent form of oppression (Cudd, 9). All forms of racial and ethnic domination would satisfy her definition insofar as the oppressor group benefits from the social constraints -- as white people, e.g., benefit from "skin privilege" even if they do not aim to do so and even if they reap the benefit involuntarily. Clearly any caste system counts as oppressive.

The issues become more controversial when it comes to cases of oppression where the constraints that disadvantage the oppressed are partially maintained by the oppressed. Women, for example, very often police one another's compliance with standard norms of beauty, comportment, marriage and reproduction. This is as true in Western cultures as it is in any other. Women also choose unpaid domestic labor within marriage or (in more and more cases) cohabitation -- a choice that demonstrably worsens their economic future and increases their risk for abuse while reducing their power within the relationship. How can women be oppressed if they not only enforce but also at times create the social constraints? Is it oppression if one chooses to participate in it -- especially when there are other alternatives available?

Here Cudd's analysis is most helpful. By explaining the mechanisms by which oppression is maintained as well as the harm the oppression does, we gain a clear picture of oppression's complex nature. Cudd explains how societies structure payoffs so that participation in oppressive institutions becomes for many women the best overall option. Her use of economic theory and psychology to explain how stereotypes as they are actually formed are not merely generalizations but distortions is enlightening. Readers unfamiliar with social psychology will find helpful a very deft introduction to the mechanisms by which stereotypes are formed and the harm that they do.

The first two sections of the book are, to my mind, the strongest, emphasizing as they do the nature of oppression and how it works in action. It is a nice blend of philosophical analysis and social science. The third part, focusing on solutions to oppression, is promising but perhaps overreaching. Cudd is careful to avoid "blaming the victim" but also insists that oppressed people are not morally free to use their status as members of an oppressed group as an excuse for doing nothing to end oppression. Oppressors are said to be more responsible than are the oppressed for ending it, because it is not always required that the oppressed resist (Cudd, 198), but it is always required that the members of the oppressor group resist (Cudd, 196). This calls for closer analysis. Is this because it is always more costly for the oppressed to resist? Cudd suggests this, but also says that oppressed people "may not understand the oppression they suffer" (Cudd, 198). This may be so, but many members of oppressor groups do not understand it either (they should read this book!), so that cannot be the basis of the distinction. In addition, it is not necessarily less costly for the members of the oppressor class to resist oppression. (Think of the Germans who paid a terrible price for resisting Nazi oppression.) Is it because the member of the oppressor group causes the oppression or maintains it? People who benefit from skin privilege often do not wish to do so, but eradicating skin privilege is a very difficult and costly (in every sense) thing to do. We can, as Cudd suggests, "renounce privilege" when we are capable of doing so, but what does that actually mean? I cannot make people in the department store more suspicious of me than they would be of my black counterpart. I can protest when I see myself being given an obvious benefit over a visible comparator, but what can I do when, e.g., my landlord rents to me at a lower price than he would otherwise because he does not want to rent to a Mexican family willing to pay more? I may not know about my other comparators, and searching for housing that involves no oppression may be very costly to me. We should all confront racism and sexism, but it is not so clear why those who are unwilling beneficiaries should do more than those who are harmed. Ultimately, I remained unpersuaded (although antecedently inclined toward accepting) Cudd's view that resistance is obligatory for all members of oppressor groups, and supererogatory for oppressed groups (Cudd, 199). Given the overlapping nature of oppression, this left me wondering who is obligated to do what.

A couple of other quibbles, which should in no way deter anyone from studying this fine book: one problem is regarding the concept of oppression, the other is a particular example explicated by Cudd. I am not sure why oppression, if properly understood, must be remediable. Why should the definition of oppression point to its solution? It may be, for example, that there will always be animal exploitation and oppression because insufficient numbers of humans will take up their cause. I think this is probably true. While it would be desirable to have a solution to animal oppression, and there can be remediation in individual cases, I do not think that even the best understanding of oppression must include an account of how we could end it. That seems like a separate issue. Similarly, while we have made many important gains in the struggle against gender oppression, I am not convinced that we will ever eradicate it. At times Cudd writes as if it is a priori true that oppression cannot be based in natural facts about humans, as in her rejection of Chodorow's psychoanalytic account of oppression (Cudd, 60). Either Chodorow provides us with the correct account of why men dominate women or she doesn't, but whether this is so has nothing to do with whether or not it is remediable. It is possible that at least some forms of oppression are partially accountable by biological facts (facts that cannot really be changed), and it does not seem right to insist that this is a necessary criterion of adequacy for a definition of oppression. This part of Cudd's analysis could use more argumentation.

A related question arises with respect to the criterion of benefit. It seems to me possible that one group could harm another without benefiting. There are real questions about why people might behave this way, but it is unclear why this should be ruled out as a case of oppression. For example, it might be shown that men do not in fact benefit from male domination and that they would do much better without it. (Consider all of the lethal violence that men are subjected to in part because of pathological gender norms for men.) Most oppression (e.g., colonialism) does benefit some members of the oppressor class, but not necessarily and perhaps not in the long run. It might be worth it to think about expanding the notion to include oppression that harms the oppressed but does not necessarily benefit the oppressor class. I think greater consideration of the distinction between privilege and benefit would be helpful here.

Finally, related to the point made above, I think it might be a misstep to make some of the particular claims about who is oppressed. At one point Cudd asserts "men are not, as a group, oppressed by their treatment by family law" because "any one individual man may be the victim of an unjust decision by a judge, but not because men are an oppressed social group." Cudd goes on to argue that the gender roles that motivate the cultural norm of placing children with their mothers "privilege men and oppress women" (Cudd, 194). Apropos of what I argued above, I think it is both possible to argue that men largely maintain patriarchy, that patriarchy harms women, and that patriarchy can turn around and oppress men. If men suffer social consequences (disconnection with their families) by virtue of their membership in a social group -- and men constitute a social group -- then in that sense men are oppressed. To point out that they create patriarchy only draws attention to the fact that women are often complicit too. A virtue of a reformative account of a moral concept is that it is not antecedently wedded to conventional ideas about particular applications of that concept. The impulse to deny the possibility that men are members of an oppressed group in at least some respects detracts from the fundamentally sound focus of this excellent book, which is to carefully set out and analyze the inherently social nature of oppression.