Anarchism/Minarchism: Is a Government Part of a Free Country?

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Roderick T. Long and Tibor R. Machan (eds.), Anarchism/Minarchism: Is a Government Part of a Free Country?, Ashgate, 2008, 208pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780754660668.

Reviewed by Nicole Hassoun, Carnegie Mellon University


Anarchism/Minarchism: Is a Government Part of a Free Country? is a well-integrated collection of articles that provides a nice introduction to some of the main arguments for and against both anarchism and minarchism, more commonly known as (minimal state) libertarianism.[1] The first part contains arguments by those inclined towards libertarianism. So, one might think the book of little interest to those who are neither anarchists nor libertarians. While many mainstream social liberals take libertarianism seriously, few are interested in anarchism. But, as Tibor Machan, Charles Johnson, Lester Hunt, and others point out in their contributions, both anarchism and the debates between libertarians and anarchists should be of broader interest to social liberals. Anarchism should be of interest because it plays the role in political philosophy that skepticism plays in epistemology -- raising the question of what, if anything, could justify a state in the way that brains in vats, etc. raise the question of what, if anything, could justify beliefs. The debate between anarchists and libertarians should be of interest because if the anarchists are right then libertarianism commits one to anarchism. So, social liberals who take libertarianism seriously may have to take anarchism seriously too.

Since the arguments in the debate between anarchists and libertarians make up the bulk of the book and should be of the broadest interest, this review will focus on these arguments. It will then sketch an argument for the following conclusion: Even if the premises in Anarchism/Minarchism's main argument for anarchy over libertarianism hold, libertarians should not be anarchists; they should be social liberals of a sort.

The main argument for anarchism (advanced by Roderick Long and Aeon Skoble among others in Anarchism/Minarchism) is roughly as follows. Libertarians (and anarchists) accept a non-aggression principle on which each person should be free as long as they respect the like freedom for others. But a state which exercises a monopoly on coercive force prohibits others from defending their rights and so is illegitimately coercive as well as inefficient and expensive. Rather, competition should be allowed over the provision of protective services.

Machan, in his essay on reconciling anarchism and libertarianism, responds on behalf of the libertarian. He suggests that it is possible that a state could come into existence with everyone's implicit consent. People could just buy protective services from the best agency around and that agency could come to have a monopoly on force in a particular area without violating anyone's rights. To support the point, Machan relies on an analogy with Microsoft which (well, pre-MacBook) had a virtual monopoly on computer software sales.[2]

Long and others respond that this argument does not explain how it can be legitimate for a state to prohibit competing protective agencies from entering the market in protective force. But Machan suggests that this is no more problematic than allowing a store to set up shop in a certain area as long as people can shop elsewhere, leaving mostly implicit a libertarian argument for open borders in a society of states.

Most businesses have at least a limited monopoly on land. Most businesses do not preclude competition in other locations but they do not allow others to set up shop in the exact same location. As long as people can go elsewhere to purchase protective services from someone else, Machan concludes, a state would not violate anyone's rights. Plus, Machan goes on, anarchists face a serious problem if they want to say geographically located monopolies are illegitimate. This would be like saying only online stores could sell their goods -- not geographically located ones.

The anarchist might respond that neither stores nor states can prohibit competitors from operating where they like unless their competitors are violating rights in doing so. Most stores do have property rights in a particular location. So, they can legitimately prohibit anyone (including their competitors) from operating on their property without consent as long as their competitors can operate somewhere. States, on the other hand, do not have property rights to everything within their borders. Normally, they do not have property rights in the property of those who have not consented to give up their property rights. Nor do states have property rights in the property of those people who do not consent to the state having those rights. So the libertarian state violates rights when it keeps other rights respecting agencies and individuals from protecting rights (just like a store would violate rights if it kept competitors from operating on land its competitors own). Saying people can move elsewhere does not answer the objection.

So, there is reason to believe the premises in the anarchist's argument are correct (though this review will suggest that with a few more relatively uncontroversial premises it is possible to show that libertarians should actually be welfare liberals).

Of course, libertarians could argue that something could qualify as a state without claiming a monopoly on coercive force (if no other entities wanted to enter the market in such force). Machan seems to suggest something like this at times. But then someone could be both an anarchist and a libertarian. For, anarchists would be happy with the mere possibility of entry into a market in coercive force, libertarians happy with the mere possibility of a single entity being the only agent to exercise coercive force in a given area (the agency need not have an in principle monopoly).

But it is hard to believe the main issue between libertarians and anarchists could be whether it is acceptable for there to be an in principle monopoly on coercive force. One who held that view could not make sense of some anarchists' exclusive focus on whether actual states are legitimate if not anarchistic (see, for instance, John Hasnas' contribution to this volume or Crispin Sartwell's argument in Against the State).[3] Furthermore, it really matters whether we should have states in the real world. So, the rest of this review will suppose that anarchists want to deny that we should have minimal states (with an in principle monopoly on coercive force) while libertarians will disagree.

If it really matters what we should say about states in the real world, however, we need to consider the relevance of empirical evidence to the debate between libertarians and anarchists. There are roughly two sorts of empirical arguments presented in Anarchism/Minarchism. John Hasnas provides the first in his contribution. Hasnas argues that we are already living in a society full of competing protection agencies and suggests that there is nothing terribly wrong with the current system. But, while this observation is interesting and probably correct, it does not provide any support for the philosophical claim that the state is not justified in claiming a monopoly on the right to exercise, and determine which other agencies can exercise, coercive force over its subjects. For, the state allows most of the protective agencies in existence to operate -- it even licenses some private security corporations.

The other empirical arguments in Anarchism/Minarchism start by observing what happens where there is no state at all. Some suggest, for instance, that constitutional states are necessary to act as an impartial arbitrator over disputes and prevent an all out war of all against all. Adam Reed and William Thomas, for instance, claim to provide historical evidence to this effect suggesting that existing anarchies are generally unstable, can only exist in poor, unimportant, under-developed places or lead to great injustices. Although these authors provide some compelling anecdotes (talking, for instance, about the Polish Lithuanian Commonwealth) there is a serious problem with these empirical arguments against anarchy. We should be careful about concluding that something is always (or even generally) true by appealing to case studies. Similarly, though anarchists like Skoble can defend themselves against the claim that anarchy always has bad consequences with counter-examples, they cannot make a convincing general case for anarchy with case studies. Furthermore, as Jan Narveson and others insightfully point out, even if there were sufficiently high quality macro-level evidence that applied as well to modern developed countries as to developing countries or tribal communities, it would almost certainly be aggregated data. Hence, those who are concerned about each person's freedom should be unimpressed. Rather, it is likely that some have done and would do better under some anarchies than under some states while others have done and would do worse under some anarchies than under some states.

This leads to a final methodological point -- it seems that both anarchists and libertarians should wonder a bit what the point is in the empirical arguments for and against anarchy. Are the arguments against anarchy, for instance, intended to show, as Narveson suggests, that anarchy is always unreasonable? And, if so, why should the anarchists care? One might ask "Why, if they want to be unreasonable, should not they be unreasonable? What can justify forcing them to live in a state if they, however unreasonably, prefer anarchy?" If what is really motivating anarchists and libertarians is a concern for individual freedom, it is hard to see how reasonableness matters. Rather, anarchists and libertarians might agree that legitimate states must secure their subjects' free consent. Anarchists would just assert that even minimal states will fail to secure free consent while libertarians would disagree. Who is right might turn on what free consent requires. But, to give the libertarian a fighting chance, we can start here with just the most minimal conditions for free consent. We can suppose that people only need some minimal reasoning and planning abilities -- that they must just be able to make and carry out simple plans. At the risk of sounding not-quite-libertarian-enough let us call this sort of freedom autonomy. Only those who cannot make any significant decisions for themselves lack this sort of freedom.

Which, finally, brings us to the argument this review promised at the start. The argument for the conclusion that libertarians should accept some kind of welfare liberalism starts from the assumption that, despite the anarchists' arguments, libertarians are not anarchists (for if they accept anarchy they would cease to be libertarians). The argument assumes, however, that libertarians should be actual consent theorists; they should agree that legitimate states must secure their subjects' free consent.

More precisely, let us make two assumptions (defended or implicit above):

1) Libertarians agree that any existing states must be legitimate and some states should exist.

2) Libertarians should agree that states, to be legitimate, must secure their subjects' autonomous consent.[4]

Let us add:

3) For states to secure their subjects' autonomous consent, they must do what they can to enable their subjects to secure sufficient autonomy to autonomously consent to their rules.

4) To secure this autonomy most people (in all states) must be able to secure some minimal amount of healthcare, food, water, and shelter.

5) So, states must do what they can to enable most of their subjects to secure these things.

Suppose further that libertarians accept the following implicit premise (which we can take to imply some commitments with regard to the definition of welfare liberalism):

6) If libertarians have to agree that states must do what they can to enable most of their subjects to secure some minimal amount of healthcare, food, water, and shelter, they must be (some kind of) welfare liberals.

We reach the following conclusion:

C) Libertarians should be (some kind of) welfare liberals.

Of course, there may also be other ways to arrive at social welfare policies from anarchistic principles (see, for instance, Charles Johnson's delightful essay in this volume). Furthermore, it is impossible to do full justice to this argument here. So, let me just say a few words about its 4th premise. See (Hassoun, 2009) for details.

The reason libertarian actual consent theorists have to accept the thesis that, insofar as possible, people must be able to secure sufficient autonomy if the states to which they are subject are to be legitimate is this. In order for someone to actually autonomously consent to a state that person must be able to do so. But, we must say more to convince libertarians that states must do what they can to enable their subjects to secure sufficient autonomy. Consider an argument for this conclusion. When states subject people who cannot secure sufficient autonomy to coercive rules and do not do whatever is possible to enable these people to secure sufficient autonomy, they act wrongly. Such states are not justified in exercising a monopoly on coercive force over those who cannot secure sufficient autonomy. If states continue to exercise a monopoly on the use of coercive force over their subjects, legitimacy requires that they do whatever they can to enable these people to secure sufficient autonomy.[5] Insofar as they exist, states do continue to exercise such a monopoly. So, they are obligated to do what they can to enable their subjects to secure sufficient autonomy.

Someone might object that states that subject people to coercive rules, even wrongly, do not thereby acquire an obligation to do what they can to enable these people to secure sufficient autonomy. Consider an analogy. Suppose someone, let us call her Samantha, who is not capable of autonomous consent agrees to give me a large sum of money. I do not thereby have a duty to do what I can to enable Samantha to secure sufficient autonomy. I merely fail to have a contract with her. Samantha has not, by agreeing to give me a large sum of money, incurred an enforceable debt to me. If I were to try to enforce the agreement on Samantha without securing her autonomous consent, I would act wrongly. But, as long as I do not try to extract any money from her, I have no obligation to her. Similarly, one might suggest, libertarians can deny the legitimacy of actual states. Yet, they can maintain that something like a state or protective organization that only enforced the rights of those who actually autonomously consent could be legitimate. Such protective organizations would not need to enable anyone to consent. Libertarians could argue as follows. The fact that legitimate states must secure all of their subjects' autonomous consent just shows that there should not be states. Protective organizations can enforce the rights of those who actually autonomously consent to their rule. They just cannot enforce the rights of those who do not or can not autonomously consent.

But that would commit the libertarian to anarchism and we are assuming that libertarians are not anarchists. Libertarians believe that, in principle, minimal states can be justified and do not advocate eliminating all states.

One might worry that this response relies on a false premise. According to the response, states can be legitimate only if they do what they can to enable their subjects to secure sufficient autonomy. Perhaps relatives or charities can enable these people to secure sufficient autonomy. If we stick with the analogy, the objection would be this. In order for Samantha to autonomously consent, I need not do what I can to enable her to do so. Perhaps her family or others involved in charitable work can help her instead. I may be able to legitimately enforce the contract without doing what I can to enable Samantha to autonomously consent.

This objection has some truth in it. Others may be able to enable those subject to a state to secure sufficient autonomy. Others may even have primary responsibility for doing so. But the objection misunderstands the nature of enabling. Enabling is like being a lender of last resort. So, in some cases, states may not need to do anything to enable someone to secure sufficient autonomy. If a person secures autonomy on his or her own or with the help of friends and benefactors the state need not do a thing to help this person. States need to step into the breech, however, if help is required. It is only if states do this that all of their subjects who are capable of securing sufficient autonomy will do so; so states must do what they can to enable their subjects to secure autonomy. This is the only way states can be legitimate in our imperfect world.

Perhaps we also require the empirical assumption that voluntary assistance has not and will not immediately eliminate poverty. But this assumption is minimal. To deny it, libertarians would have to show that there is not a single person who could secure autonomy more quickly with the state's assistance (in addition to voluntary assistance) than with voluntary assistance alone.

In short, the anarchist's argument against libertarianism in Anarchism/Minarchism provides a key premise in reaching the conclusion that the libertarian should be some kind of welfare liberal. But, while there is a lot to say about the details of the arguments in Anarchism/Minarchism the collection as a whole provides a nice introduction to the engaging debate between libertarians and anarchists. Liberals of all sorts would do well to take the arguments presented in this collection seriously.[6]


Nicole Hassoun. 2009. "Libertarian Welfare Rights?" University of Washington Conference on Global Justice in the 21st Century. April 17, 2009. University of Washington: Seattle. Available at: <>.

Crispin Sartwell. 2008. Against the State: An Introduction to Anarchist Political Theory. State University of New York Press: Albany.

[1] So, libertarian will be used throughout to refer to those people who are inclined towards minarchism as opposed to anarcho-capitalism.

[2] Still, Microsoft never had a complete monopoly and it is hard to see how any protective organization could have such a monopoly as some cannot enter into free contracts at all.

[3] See (Sartwell, 2008). There is much more room for, in principle, ideal theory arguments in political philosophy than Sartwell allows. It would also be good if Sartwell considered whether states can be more or less legitimate in the real world. But, he never loses sight of the important issue of whether states are legitimate in the real world.

[4] Libertarians probably also hold that for any existing state to be legitimate it must only exercise coercive force over (rights respecting) individuals to protect these individuals' liberty. Such an assumption would rule out obvious objections to the argument sketched here but this review cannot discuss these issues. See (Hassoun, 2009) for discussion.

[5] Assume here and in what follows that at least some of these subjects respect others' rights.

[6] The reviewer would like to thank all of the participants and panelists at the Molinari session at the 2008 Eastern APA where she acted as a critic on this book, but especially Tibor Machan, Jan Narveson, Roderick Long, and William Thomas. She also owes thanks to many people for their help with the paper "Libertarian Welfare Rights?" from which the argument given at the end is drawn (please see the acknowledgements section in that paper for details).