Anarchy and Legal Order: Law and Politics for a Stateless Society

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Gary Chartier, Anarchy and Legal Order: Law and Politics for a Stateless Society, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 428pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107032286.

Reviewed by Jason Brennan, Georgetown University


A government, or a state, by definition, is a subset of a society that claims a monopoly on the right to create rules and to enforce these rules via coercion.[1] A central concern in political philosophy is to determine whether such a monopoly can be justified. Gary Chartier argues it cannot. Chartier thinks the state is unjust and unnecessary. He argues that the state violates certain foundational moral principles, encourages predation and exploitation, and does more to harm the vulnerable than to protect them. This would be tolerable only if there were no feasible good alternatives to the state. Chartier argues that a form of cooperative anarchism is possible. He argues that legal order would arise and could be adequately maintained in the absence of a state.

Chartier claims his goal in Anarchy and Legal Order is to articulate and defend "an anarchist position that is identifiably leftist, anticapitalist, and socialist, while also hospitable to robust possessory claims, . . . mutually beneficial exchange . . . [and] voluntary cooperation." (xiii) Chartier also claims he is for "markets, not capitalism".[2] Chartier's self-description may be misleading. What he really means to do is defend a kind of anarcho-capitalism, the kind that Robert Nozick argues against in the first six chapters of Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Chartier calls his work "socialist" because he devotes lengthy sections to expressing the hope that his form of anarchism would inspire extensive solidarity among free people, because he thinks that in the absence of state power, worker cooperatives would have a better chance of surviving in competition against corporations, and because certain early free-market thinkers referred to themselves as socialists. (398)

Chartier is trying to argue for extremely controversial conclusions, conclusions most philosophers are inclined to reject. One might suggest that he begin with commonsense moral ideas and principles, that is, with premises almost everybody accepts, in order to show that these lead to his more controversial conclusions. Chartier takes the opposite path. Chapter 1, called "Foundations," attempts to defend a neo-Thomist natural law theory of ethics. Hardly any philosophers accept this kind of moral theory, and even those who do work within the Neo-Thomist natural law tradition do not accept Chartier's particular version of it.

Starting with controversial foundations burdens Chartier with having to provide a compelling argument for those foundations. No such argument appears. On the contrary, Chartier sets himself up to bite bullets. So, for instance, Chartier asserts that different aspects of well-being are incommensurable. (21-22) He says that there is simply no truth of the matter about whether, for example, one friendship is more intrinsically valuable than another, or whether a day at the museum better contributes to our well-being than a day spent with friends. Chartier does not mean that making such judgments is difficult; rather, he means the more radical claim that there is no literally no truth of the matter about which intrinsic goods contribute more to our well-being. This will seem obviously false to most readers. It seems obvious to me that a day spent marrying the love of my life is better than a day spent watching a movie I only slightly enjoy. Chartier's response is to tell us, in full confidence, that it is just "silly" (22) to suppose so. Perhaps he is right and I am silly, but I would like to see a compelling argument why.

I was hoping that readers could just skip Chartier's foundations chapter. It would strengthen his argument if his other chapters didn't need to rest on it. However, Chartier's implausible moral theory infects later chapters. For instance, on page 192, Chartier plans to undermine the public goods argument for the state. (The public goods argument holds that the state is justified because it is necessary to produce certain vitally important public goods.) To attack this argument, Chartier says that it is impossible to objectively rank one state of affairs as better than another state of affairs; therefore, there is simply no such thing as the optimal level of public goods provision. Indeed, "optimal public goods provision" is an incoherent idea, like "square circle". When I read this, I hoped that Chartier just meant to make the more plausible claims, associated with Rawls and Nozick, that people have separate lives to lead, and that we cannot usually trade the welfare of one person for another's. However, Chartier really does mean that it is incoherent to suppose a world in which everyone is virtuous and happy is better than a world in which everyone is in a pain amplifier. I regard this as a reductio of his moral theory and the moral foundations of his book.

Chartier also confidently tells us (26) that it is irrational or unreasonable to do things for the sake of non-sentient objects. Now, someone familiar with Richard Sylvan's last man thought experiment might object to this point. Sylvan asks you to imagine that you know you are the only sentient being that will ever inhabit Earth. Before you die, you consider blowing up the last majestic redwood tree for no reason whatsoever. Upon reflection, many of us think that there is something wrong with being the kind of person who would be willing to do that. Sylvan takes this to show that we can have moral reasons to respect even non-sentient creatures or objects.[3] Chartier's best response to this kind of objection is just to say that people who think like Sylvan are probably confused about whether trees are sentient; otherwise, they're clearly irrational and unreasonable.

And so it goes throughout the book. Chartier has a tendency to use the words "obviously" or "clearly" to demarcate claims that are not obvious or clear. He often dismisses commonly held positions that most smart people find quite sensible. For instance (to borrow an example my colleague John Hasnas pointed out to me), Chartier confidently announces that "there is no reason to think" that the state could do a better job helping promote the welfare of the least advantaged "than someone tasked with doing so by conscience, community-sanctioned role, or personal self-interest." (388) Chartier needs to prove this, not assume it. In fact, most of the smart people I know can give smart and compelling grounds for believing the opposite. They sensibly assume that anarchist societies will do less than modern welfare capitalist states like Denmark to help the least advantaged members of society. (I'll return to this point below.)

Chapter 3 begins by noting that states need to be justified. After all, states create hierarchies of power, and it's not clear what could justify giving some subset of society monopoly rights on coercion. Chartier also points out that even in modern European welfare states, the strong and well-connected often capture state power to prey upon the weak. This is all sensible stuff, but we have heard it before and heard it better presented by others. By the end of the chapter, Chartier announces, "Peaceful, voluntary cooperation can clearly occur [on a large scale] in the state's absence." (182) But he has not yet made this clear. He does show that people have a wide range of incentives to cooperate with one another, but comes nowhere near proving that these incentives are strong enough to make anarchism work on any large scale.

Chapters 4 and 5 mean to explain how an anarchist society could create and enforce laws. The best parts of these chapters are the footnotes and citations. There is a long literature on how the common law or merchant law developed and was enforced without state assistance. Chartier cites an important literature in experimental economics which provides evidence that assurance contracts can solve the problem of public goods. He cites arguments and cases in legal theory that may tend to show that tort law can be as good or perhaps better than top-down state-enforced regulation. And so on. These literatures together amount to a serious challenge to the claim that the state is necessary. But Chartier's presentation of it here is not potentially convincing to those who do not already agree, because he does not adequately explain these background literatures to uninitiated readers.

One major argument for the state is grounded on the idea of social justice. Consider the following argument: Coercive social institutions must be justifiable to all. For institutions to be justifiable to all, they must tend to ensure that even the least advantaged lead a sufficiently good life. The state is necessary to guarantee this result. Therefore, the state is justified. Most political philosophers find some variation on this argument compelling; therefore, Chartier must take care to show that the state is not in fact necessary to realize social justice so described. Chartier responds by saying, "Solidaristicaction could play a key role in non-state responses to poverty and economic insecurity." (337) "Solidarity could lead to both need-focused redistribution and the creation of mutual aid networks," he adds. (338) However, he does not try to show us that solidaristic action will work, or even that there is a decent chance that it will work. He leaves it at "could". But that's not good enough. I wonder whether Chartier relies too heavily on the emergence of a New Anarchist Man (akin to the New Soviet Man).

The most interesting and important aspects of the book are 1) its discussion of libertarian class theory, and 2) the arguments from left-libertarianism and public choice economics that modern states tend to increase the size and power of hierarchical corporations. However, reading through this book for these good bits is somewhat like flying from New York to Sydney in order to enjoy the in-flight meal.[4]

I expect the book's writing style will be a major barrier to it persuading readers. Chartier's prose reads as if it were a translation of an eighteenth century German philosophy text. He often uses neologisms and needless jargon. For instance, he talks about "justified possessory claims" rather than "private property." His arguments are also long and drawn out. Most major arguments have thirteen or fourteen premises. Chartier begins each chapter by articulating these premises, which are usually a mix of tautologies, unclear claims, and controversial moral or empirical claims. The chapters proceed with sections, subsections, and sub-subsections devoted to articulating and defending each premise, subpremise, and sub-subpremise. These sections, subsections, and sub-subsections frequently fail to elucidate the unclear claims or to provide compelling arguments for the controversial premises. It is difficult to remember what is at stake or why the current topic is being discussed. Chartier also includes lengthy digressions about issues such as whether it is permissible to enslave animals (93-108) or whether intellectual property can be justified. This is a book to be read slowly.

Most people assume the state is necessary. There could be real value in a book that systematically attacks this assumption. But this is not the best book for that purpose. Instead, I recommend looking at Michael Huemer's The Problem of Political Authority: An Examination of the Right to Coerce and the Duty to Obey, published by Palgrave MacMillan a month after Chartier's book. Every place Chartier goes wrong, Huemer goes right. Like Chartier, he argues for anarchism over statism. However, unlike Chartier, he recognizes that his central conclusions are highly controversial. Huemer knows what is at stake and why his readers will be inclined to disagree. He carefully constructs simple arguments for his conclusions, relying not on controversial moral or empirical assumptions, but instead on commonsense moral intuitions, principles, and widely accepted empirical claims. His prose is clean, concise, and engaging. Huemer knows anarchism seems crazy, but he manages to make it seem like commonsense.

[1] Gregory Kavka, "Why Even Morally Perfect People Would Need Government," Social Philosophy and Policy 12 (1995): 1-18, here p. 2.

[2] Gary Chartier and Charles Johnson, eds., Markets, not Capitalism: Individualist Anarchism against Bosses, Inequality, Corporate Power, and Structural Poverty (New York: Minor Compositions, 2011).

[3] See David Schmidtz and Elizabeth Willott, eds., Environmental Ethics: What Really Matters, What Really Works (New York: Oxford University Press, 2002), xiii.

[4] See instead Roderick Long, "Toward a Libertarian Theory of Class," Social Philosophy and Policy 15 (1998): 303-349.