Anatomy of Failure: Philosophy and Political Action

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Oliver Feltham, Anatomy of Failure: Philosophy and Political Action, Bloomsbury, 2013, 290pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441158642.

Reviewed by Julian Culp, Goethe University, Frankfurt am Main


Oliver Feltham's book offers a subtle account of joint action as a model of political action. Feltham extracts this model from the political writings and practice of the alliance between the Levellers and the New Model Army in 1647. This alliance aspired to establish equal rights and freedoms for all freeborn people of England in the settlement of the civil war in the aftermath of the English revolution of 1640-1642. Therefore it stood in fierce opposition to the parliament and the vanquished king.

There are three reasons why this book should be of great interest for political theorists, social and political philosophers and historians of ideas. By providing a normative reconstruction of the model of joint political action, Feltman probes and exemplifies a distinctive way of answering the question of how to conceive the relation between the theory and practice of politics. In addition, he sharpens our understanding of Hobbes's model of sovereign political action and Locke's model of contractual political action while contrasting the rather neglected model of joint action with these two more prominent models. Finally, Feltman provides a fuller appreciation of the theoretical importance of the political developments and historical circumstances after the English revolution. This is because he carves out the model of joint action through a rich, historically informed analysis of the three major manifestos of the alliance between the Levellers and the New Model Army: A Solemn Engagement, The Case of the Army Truly Stated, and An Agreement of the People (all 1647).

The book's title refers both to Feltham's philosophical motivation and to his methodological approach. He holds that up to now philosophers who have presented models of political action have either delivered an "angelic critique" or a "servile apology" (p. 10). While the former neglects the realities of political practice and thereby fails to be effectively action guiding, the latter merely provides a rationalization of the status quo. It is Feltham's central motivation to offer models of political action that move beyond both "angelic critique" and "servile apology". He thus urges: "we need to address the failure of the philosophical idea faced with the particular political event." (p. 22)

Feltham's way of furnishing such models of political action that avoid this failure consists in carefully examining ruptures and breakdowns of political practices like those observable in the aftermath of the English revolution (p. 26). In such contexts the already established political institutions no longer function well, if at all, and deep disagreements exist over how to solve practical problems in the future. Such situations of political failure not only give rise to new political actors and institutions but also to new ideas and deliberations about how to frame and address political issues. Therefore they provide a fertile ground "to map the model" of political action that is "embodied in political practices" (p. 26).

Feltham begins unfolding the joint model of political action through an in-depth analysis of the evolving political motivation, structure, and struggles of the alliance between the Levellers and the New Model Army (Chapter 2). The New Model Army defeated the royalist forces in 1646, but the House of Commons neither paid the soldiers nor did the soldiers receive indemnities. In order to voice their frustration, the agitators, who were elected by the soldiers, joined with the Levellers. This alliance published the manifesto A Solemn Engagement, thereby constituting itself a political actor. In this manisfesto, the alliance declared its aspiration to establish equal rights and freedoms for all freeborn people of England and claimed to speak in their name. Thus it contested the parliament's role as the sole representative of the people.

The behavior of the alliance was driven by "logic of entailment" (p. 53). The soldiers' fight against the royalist forces as commoners, and not as mere mercenaries, meant for that the members of the New Model Army had the obligation to finalize the yet incomplete project of extending the franchise to all people of England in the settlement of the civil war. So the soldiers' role during the war was consequential for their subsequent political self-understanding. This logic of entailment reflects how political identities and goals can arise through joint action.

Before further developing this model of political action inherent in the practice of the alliance by way of contrast with Hobbes's and Locke's models of this kind, Feltham makes a rather lengthy excursus and explains these two thinkers' views on the metaphysics of action (Chapter 3) and religious toleration (Chapter 4). The breadth of these two chapters is perhaps slightly excessive in light of their limited relevance for the juxtaposition of the three models of political action. But they are certainly illuminating in many respects.

They contain, for instance, a comparison between Luther's and Hobbes' view on the separation between inner and external actions. Feltham brings out that Hobbes, in contrast to Luther, relies on the idea of disjoint action. This allows Hobbes to explain the possibility of the existence of a plurality of (inner) faiths within the Christian commonwealth that he defends. This is because the idea of disjoint action enables him to say that while the sovereign owns all individuals' external actions, including those pertaining to public worship, it does not control its subjects' inner faiths. Thereby, Feltham points out, "Luther's legacy has been perverted" (p. 180). After all, while Luther insists that a work of faith requires a certain inner attitude, "The work itself is an action that leaves traces in the world, that emanates and thus transmits the subjective attitude from which it was born" (p. 138).

But the juxtaposition of three models of political action is where the action is in Anatomy of Failure. Feltham presents Hobbes' model of sovereign action (Chapter 5), Locke's model of contractual action (Chapter 5), and the Leveller-agitator model of joint action (Chapter 6). He differentiates these three models on the basis of (1) whom they identify as political agents, (2) what they view as the normative ground for political action, and (3) how they measure political success and failure.

(1) In Hobbes's model the only political agent is the sovereign. The subjects, who confer on the sovereign the right to rule, act only through the sovereign. This ensures the absence of divisive political factions that would threaten the order and stability of the commonwealth (191-96). In Locke's contractual model of political action, by contrast, there are multiple actors in political society: the legislative, executive, and federative powers (which are responsible for the relations among political societies), and all individuals (who have a right to resistance) (pp. 220-23, 229-34).

On the Leveller-agitator model of joint action people can act collectively by creating and fostering alliances across several factions of society. Unlike Hobbes' perspective, this model does not view the plurality and heterogeneity of the people as a threat to stability. The New Model Army's members' experiences with a variety of groups and individuals from many different parts of society help explain this feature of the model of political practice immanent in the alliance's practice (pp. 255-56). Moreover, in contrast to Locke, not only atomized individuals can oppose government; instead, people can create alliances and act collectively in opposition to the government (pp. 259-64). The more alliances are realized and the more effective these alliances are in reshaping the internal orders of their respective social contexts, the more power they possesses.

(2) Hobbes and Locke agree that the normative ground of political action is the realization of natural law, which for Hobbes requires the preservation of all subjects (pp. 196-97) and for Locke the protection of private property (pp. 213-14). In the Leveller-agitator model political action aims at establishing the principle of popular sovereignty and at ensuring that all freeborn people of England enjoy equal rights, including the right to religious freedom. In more concrete terms, the alliance between the New Model Army and the Levellers demanded a proper settlement of the war, which required a reform of parliament, and an end to the unrepresentative decisions of the House of Lords and the monarchy (pp. 264-65).

(3) Finally, how do these three models differ with regard to how they measure political success and failure? Following the model of sovereign action, the measure of political success and failure is binary. The sovereign's law can be threatened, among other things, by other sources of the law, for example sacred scripture. Yet if the sovereign is truly sovereign, and thus the exclusive source of the law, then such problems disappear. But if not, then the state of nature immediately sets in again (unless a conqueror becomes a new sovereign) (p. 206).

On the contractual model political action succeeds to the extent that political society better secures individuals' private property than it would be secured in the state of nature. While social cooperation to that end is also feasible in the state of nature, political society promises to do a better job because binding norms can be made more transparent and the law of nature can be applied more accurately and reliably (p. 246).

The Leveller-agitator model's most basic measure of success is the very existence and continuity of the political alliance. Beyond that, success depends on the extent to which the alliance widens its circles, connects formerly unrelated agents, and alters the internal structures of the contexts in which it operates. Thus in this model success and failure occur within various social settings and require a multi-faceted assessment (pp. 267-68). It is measured neither at the level of society as a whole, nor at the aggregated level of individuals' enjoyment of secure private property.

Anatomy of Failure is an intriguing philosophical inquiry. It pursues an ambitious methodological approach that avoids the idealism, or transcendentalism, of the political philosophy that philosophers like Raymond Geuss and Amartya Sen have criticized recently. Its reconstructive method is closely attuned to actual political practice, but strives to refrain from vindicating the status quo. Therefore it focuses on those moments of political rupture in which many sorts of political practice represent themselves as forms of critique of the dominant political order. This is an appealing approach, and Feltham shows how well it works for "unveiling the forgotten model" (p. 251) of joint action.

However, as Feltham concedes, "If practices are plural, then there is more than one model of political action" (p. 27). But this, of course, raises the question of how to assess these models of political action when practical guidance is needed and the models disagree about which political actor ought to do what. Normative standards immanent in political practices are insufficient to answer this. Feltham's methodological approach requires further philosophical argument in order to avoid this kind of failure.