Anaxagoras of Clazomenae: Fragments and Testimonia

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Patricia Curd, Anaxagoras of Clazomenae: Fragments and Testimonia, University of Toronto Press, 2007, 279pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802093257.

Reviewed by Malcolm Schofield, St John's College, University of Cambridge


Anaxagoras (c.500 - c.428 BC) was the first mind-matter dualist in Western philosophy. In Plato's Phaedo Socrates famously tells us of his sense of anticipation when on picking up Anaxagoras's book he saw that nous, intellect, was to have a key role in the explanation of things -- and of his subsequent disappointment when it turned out to be just another exposition of material causation untinged by teleology. Of that book a few fragments survive, mostly in the pages of the late antique Aristotelian commentator Simplicius. Otherwise we rely on testimonia: reports and summaries varying in trustworthiness by Plato, Aristotle, Theophrastus (who tells us most of what we know about Anaxagoras's theory of sense perception), and a variety of other Greek and Latin authors, once at least in Arabic translation.

For the English-speaking reader who needs access to a reliable translation of the fragments (give or take textual problems and the uncertainties of Anaxagorean Greek), there have been several options, sharply reduced in number if you want the Greek original included. The publication of Patricia Curd's long awaited edition gives us something much fuller: not only the Greek texts of the fragments with English translation and notes (mostly philosophical), but translations into English of all the testimonia included in the standard Greek edition of H. Diels and W. Kranz. These are supplemented by five substantial essays, patient, discriminating, and well-informed in their scholarship. Here Curd deals first with Anaxagoras's life, intellectual context, and interpretation by later Greek thinkers, before turning to discuss the main themes of his philosophy. An introduction, bibliography and indexes round off the volume. Like its predecessors in the Phoenix Presocratic series, the book is beautifully presented by the University of Toronto Press.

Anaxagoras is one of the most ingenious and subtle thinkers among the Presocratics. But working out what exactly he thought about mind and matter has proved a controversial and to a degree frustrating project. Matter is what used to get the lion's share of philosophical attention in the modern scholarship; and Curd duly devotes two of her five essays to discussion of Anaxagoras's theory. Mind and particularly its action on matter -- the dimension of the system which attracted Socrates' hopes -- have prompted some of the most interesting recent writing on Anaxagoras. Some of the interpretative problems become apparent when we consider one of the relevant fragments (albeit a fragment that makes no explicit reference to intellect), which I cite in Curd's version (Fr.4a):

Since these things are so, it is right to think that there are many different things present in everything that is being combined, and seeds of all things, having all sorts of forms, colours, and flavours, and that humans and also the other animals were compounded, as many as have soul. Also that there are cities that have been constructed by humans and works made, just as with us, and that there are a sun and a moon and other heavenly bodies for them, just as with us, and the earth grows many things for them, the most valuable of which they gather into their household and use. I have said this about the separation off, because there would be separation off not only for us but also elsewhere.

'Separation off', of a cosmos from 'the totality', is the work of intellect, as the extended Fr.12 spells out. The last words of Fr.4a -- 'but also elsewhere' -- suggest an argument for intellect's creation by separation not of one but of multiple worlds.

Is that what Anaxagoras meant? If it is, how is the argument meant to work? Curd reviews the issues and the scholarly discussion with her characteristic care in her fifth essay, on 'Anaxagorean Science'. The Neoplatonist Simplicius would like 'elsewhere' to be a reference to the intelligible world, and the mention of 'seeds' and 'forms' a hint at the eternal archetypes. But as Curd says, he is unsure of his interpretation, and ends up remarking that the issue is worth further investigation. Modern scholars have mostly been swayed by evidence (call it 'the single cosmos constraint') that in antiquity Anaxagoras was not reckoned among those who postulated a plurality of worlds, like the Presocratic atomists after him, but as a proponent of a single cosmos. So a variety of options have been tried out that don't commit Anaxagoras to more than one world. Perhaps he means to argue for the necessity of the outcomes of separation from an original homogeneous matter by envisaging a purely hypothetical alternative world -- his point being that such a world could reasonably be expected to be just like the actual world we inhabit. Perhaps (Simplicius already knew an interpretation on these lines) he is merely asserting the necessity of the emergence of civilisation elsewhere on earth. Or perhaps with Mansfeld (and Schofield) we should recall Anaxagoras's doctrine (Fr.6) that complexity is not a function of size, let 'in everything that is combined' take all that follows within its scope, and suppose that he is here positing in every phenomenal compound a microworld isomorphic with our macroscopic cosmos.

Curd marshals judicious considerations against all these possibilities. Her own proposal in effect (if not intention) abandons the single cosmos constraint, and makes of Anaxagoras a thinker much more like the Presocratic atomists than he is usually taken to be. Her Anaxagoras posits emergence of 'world-systems' (as we might say, 'solar systems', each with a biosphere like our own) in other regions of the one universe.[1] Anaxagoras's point will have been that given an original mixture, and given that everything that gets combined by the process of separation from that mixture continues to contain something of everything, and given that separation occurs throughout the universe, 'there will be similar results wherever separation occurs' (p.222). Curd's notion of an Anaxagorean 'world-system' is precisely what the atomists called a kosmos, and indeed it has often been thought likely that when Democritus said that in some kosmoi there is no sun or moon, and that some are devoid of living creatures and plants and all moisture, he will have meant to be disagreeing with Anaxagoras -- taking him to be a believer in a plurality of worlds like himself. I think Curd would have done better to go for broke, like David Sedley in Creationism and its Critics in Antiquity (which appeared a month or so after Curd's book), and simply accept that Anaxagoras recognised a plurality of kosmoi.

Of course, it remains unlikely that Anaxagoras ever put it quite like that, otherwise antiquity would have found it hard to leave him off the list of those who held that position. What he does talk about at the beginning of Fr.4a is sunkrinomena, 'things being aggregated', 'aggregations', an expression which occurs only here in the fragments (Curd's rendering 'everything that is being combined' unfortunately obliterates the plural). If Anaxagoras is envisaging plural worlds in this fragment, this must be the best candidate for an explicit reference to them, as Sedley assumes. Perhaps accordingly we should suppose that when sufficient matter is separated off from the original mixture, then if it aggregates together a world will then form from it, rather as in atomism when a spherical membrane is formed containing 'all sorts of bodies' within it. Perhaps what Fr.4a goes on to describe are the ingredients every such aggregate contains, and the development of human, animal, and plant life which sun, moon, and earth foster within the cosmos that emerges within the aggregate.

The comparison with atomist cosmology prompts a question. Why are the Anaxagorean world-systems posited by Curd all the same in structure and content when the atomists' differ? We know why the atomists posit cosmic variety. It is an inevitable consequence of the random effects of the collisions of atoms infinite in number in an infinite universe that cosmic formation will never be likely to happen just the same way twice. Why are things different for Anaxagoras? Is it his theory of mind or his theory of matter that makes the difference?

Curd would reject the dilemma. With much (if not universal) support from previous scholarship, she rejects any idea that matter is for Anaxagoras particulate in structure. He thinks of it in terms of what we would call stuffs, identified at the most basic level in terms of contrarieties such as the hot and the cold, the wet and the dry, the bright and the dark, which in various permutations form more complex but still elemental stuffs. Once a mechanism for separation from the same original mixture of these same ingredients is triggered, the same processes of dissociation and combination will ensue. Identical preconditions and processes of differentiation for world construction yield systems that are predictably identical in all their main features. But it is only because preconditions, ingredients, and processes are known to be as they are by intellect that it will trigger the mechanism in the first place. Intellect, she says, does not merely cause world-creation, but directs and organises it (e.g. pp.199, 204).

The notion of direction and organisation in play here deserves examination. According to Curd, Anaxagoras doesn't create the world as it is 'for a particular reason' (p.220); in particular, not in order to achieve any good 'independent of the whole system' (p.205). She claims: 'Nous can reasonably be said to have arranged and ordered things because it set the rotation going and understands how things will combine (given the ingredients in the mix)' -- each of which she has argued 'has a nature and character of its own, independent of Nous (even though Nous has knowledge of them)' (p.220). This claim seems to require that Nous knows (i) the independent nature of the ingredients in the mixture, and (ii) 'laws of nature' which again obtain independently of Nous -- more specifically, the combinations that a rotatory process of separation will systematically produce from such ingredients in such a mixture (p.204). It will be due to (ii) in particular that Anaxagoras can 'in a minimal sense' (ibid.) predicate of Nous creation and 'direction' of an ordered cosmos. The systematicity of the effects of separation can be described as a planned outcome inasmuch as it constitutes an order known in advance to be the inevitable result of the rotation Nous decides to trigger -- not (as Socrates had been hoping) an order designed to achieve some independently specified good. The order itself is good enough.

An analogy might be helpful. This looks like a form of planning comparable with the directing and organising of a planned explosion. Given scientific knowledge of the explosive, the environmental conditions, and the materials targeted for explosion, the results of the detonation can reasonably be said to have come about by the plan and through the direction of the agent who commands that knowledge -- whether or not there was any end that the agent was trying to achieve other than the explosion itself (no doubt there usually would be some such further end, but planned explosion doesn't require it). Of course, human agents ordinarily have some choice e.g. about how much explosive to use, where to place it, and so forth. Whether Anaxagoras's Nous has any analogous control over the process of separation seems doubtful. But Curd would I imagine argue that that is strictly irrelevant to whether it may properly be said to direct and organise the generation of our cosmos -- and all the others like it. It's sufficient for direction and organisation that Nous knew precisely what the effects of separation would be and decided to initiate it for that very reason -- because an ordered cosmos such as ours would result.

Although Curd doesn't spell out the interpretation as fully and emphatically as she might have done, in my view she is successful in identifying a minimalist sense of intelligent direction that is consistent with Anaxagoras's principal account of the nature and activity of Nous (in Fr.12). But we began discussion by considering the other world(s) passage at Fr.4a. Is Curd's minimalist idea of direction also able to give a basis for making best sense of this text? Hermann Fränkel long ago pointed to the thoroughgoing anthropocentric focus of this text, with 'sun, moon, stars and earth … mentioned only as existing for men, i.e. for human uses', with particularly striking reference to the earth's bounty. Such considerations have suggested to scholars (myself included) that Anaxagoras here presupposes a stronger, providential conception of design.

Curd doesn't, so far as I can see, specifically assess this suggestion. Anaxagoras's commitment to providential design has now been forcefully argued afresh by David Sedley in the first chapter of Creationism. He puts particular weight on Anaxagoras's postulate that there will be sun and moon not just in our world but 'elsewhere'. He remarks (p.22):

There seems absolutely no reason why accident alone should have ensured that each world had precisely one large fiery rock in its upper atmosphere, and one large non-fiery mass of earth capable of absorbing and reflecting light from the first. If all the other worlds can be conjectured to have a sun and a moon, the only plausible explanation is that nous is assumed to have planned and created them that way… . It not only sets up the original hothouse conditions in which the ubiquitous seeds will germinate, but also provides the right heavenly bodies to serve the vital agricultural needs of the humans who will emerge from the primeval earth.

Fr.4a does not say anything explicit about Nous at all, of course, let alone that (like the god of Genesis) on surveying sun and moon and harvest it saw that it was good -- just as it had designed it to be. Nor does Fr.12 say that the rotation initiated by Nous was so programmed as to select for the generation of conditions optimal for creation of a biosphere particularly propitious for human life (instead of for some quite different systematic outcome). Yet the hypothesis that it was is no less consistent than Curd's minimalist proposal with Fr.12: the text (like so much in Anaxagoras) underdetermines interpretation.

Curd for her part stresses that in any Anaxagorean rotation heavy and dense materials, like light and bright ones, will behave in the same way (p.221). So in any one might well expect random bits of earth to fly off into the ethereal regions, and sometimes (but not always) ignite there, either circling round like sun and moon, or hurtling downwards again like meteorites: just the features of Anaxagoras's system, in fact, that for his contemporaries marked him out as a religious sceptic. If Curd is allowed a second edition, I'm sure she will give Sedley's creationist Anaxagoras the same shrewd and measured appraisal as she does all the other attempts to make sense of his theories with which she engages in Anaxagoras of Clazomenae.

[1] She seems to take the hypothesis of a single universe as enabling compliance with the single cosmos constraint. But on that view the atomists too would count as compliant with it: their multiple worlds are all situated within 'the all'.