Ancient Forgiveness: Classical, Judaic, and Christian

Placeholder book cover

Charles L. Griswold and David Konstan (eds.), Ancient Forgiveness: Classical, Judaic, and Christian, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 260pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521119481.

Reviewed by William E. Mann, University of Vermont


Some back-story is in order. In Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration (CUP, 2007) Charles Griswold maintained that "While it is true that in the Western tradition forgiveness came to prominence in Judaic and Christian thought, I see no reason why we should be bound by its historical genealogy" (xv). In his 2010 book, Before Forgiveness: The Origins of a Moral Idea (CUP) David Konstan argued that

the modern concept of forgiveness, in the full or rich sense of the term, did not exist in classical antiquity. . . . What is more, it is not fully present in the Hebrew Bible, nor again in the New Testament or in the early Jewish and Christian commentaries on the Holy Scriptures; it would still be centuries -- many centuries -- before the idea of interpersonal forgiveness, and the set of values and attitudes that necessarily accompany and help to define it, would emerge (ix).

The co-editors of the volume under review thus appear to disagree about when forgiveness arose, but converge on the opinion that it is not to be found, for example, in ancient Greek thought and action.

This earlier work sets the agenda for the present volume. It is a collection of twelve essays, eleven of which might be described as studies in conceptual archaeology. Many of the contributors are primarily classicists. The twelfth essay -- actually the first in the volume -- is by philosopher Adam Morton, and was intended to provide the other contributors with some basic signposts in orienting themselves around the contemporary "forgiveness territory." After that, the volume divides into three major sections: three essays under the heading "Forgiveness among the Greeks," three under the heading "Forgiveness among the Romans," five under "Judaic and Christian Forgiveness." After providing a foretaste of the contents I will comment on some methodological misgivings.

According to Morton, "forgiveness involves a forgiver, a forgiven, an issue between them, and emotions that both must feel" (6). Forgiveness is an example of what Morton calls a "linkage," something that involves emotions but is distinct from them. The forgiver will typically have harbored "resentment-like emotions;" the forgiven will have had "abasement- or repentance-like emotions." When both parties have those emotions replaced by "reconciliation-like emotions," forgiveness will have occurred (7-8). Morton concludes his essay by citing two purposes that can be achieved by forgiveness. The first is reconciliation, the return to a kind of moral status quo ante beneficial to both parties. The second is the bringing about of an exercise of empathetic imagination, putting oneself in the other's shoes, an exercise performable by both forgiver and forgiven.

The three essays dealing with the ancient Greeks have this theme in common: literary contexts in which something resembling forgiveness appears are contexts sensitive to the differential status of the protagonists. Such contexts often use the word sungnōmē, for which Liddell, Scott, and Jones's Greek-English Lexicon (LSJ) lists "fellow-feeling, forbearance, lenient judgment, allowance" as meanings. In "Assuaging Rage" David Konstan argues that sungnōmē in these contexts does not indicate forgiveness. It applies instead to situations in which a person of subservient status attempts to appease someone more powerful who has taken offense, whether rightly or not, at something the other has done. Appeasement consists not in confession but rather in offering an excuse that shows that the offending agent's action was involuntary or done in ignorance. We have, then, a sharp distinction between excusing (or overlooking) and forgiving. At least one philosophical tradition, Stoicism, tolerated the former practice while forbidding the latter on grounds that it is incompatible with justice. "A wise man will disdain a slight on the part of a fool. . . . But this does not mean that he will be inclined to forgiveness, for that would be to ignore the claims of justice -- in effect, to condone the crime" (20-21).

Relations of unequal status occur among warriors, family members whose conflicting obligations lie at the core of Greek tragedy, and family members whose entanglements form the basis of New Comedy. Konstan, along with Page duBois in "Achilles, Psammenitus, and Antigone," claim to find no clear case of forgiveness in the Homeric epics. In "All in the Family" Kathryn Gutzwiller parts ways with Konstan's general thesis, finding it natural enough to describe many of the reconciliations in Menander's comedies as cases of forgiveness. Gutzwiller alludes to a passage from the Nicomachean Ethics (1136a5-9) in which Aristotle "carefully delineates objective standards for what is forgivable and what is not" (53). Here we might have expected to find a definitive statement. The Greek, obligingly, has sungnōmonika. But prominent English versions differ on its translation. Ross has "excusable." Irwin has "to be pardoned." Rowe has "to call for sympathy." Ross's choice favors Konstan's thesis. Irwin understands "pardon" to involve an exercise of discretionary exception: the pardoner sees in the instant case something that warrants exempting the offender from the application of a rule that is generally valid. For all that Aristotle says, the something seen in the offender by the pardoner might be one of Morton's repentance-like emotions. By stressing a state of mind, Rowe's translation lays a foundation for the reconciliation-like emotions that are part of the forgiveness linkage. The sharp distinction alleged to exist between excusing and forgiving appears to be blurred here.

The three essays on the Romans continue the unequal status theme. The notion at the forefront of these essays is clementia (clemency). In "The Anger of Tyrants and the Forgiveness of Kings," Susanna Morton Braund concentrates on the role that Seneca may have played in commending clementia to rulers as a virtue of self-restraint, manifested in mildness of behavior. Conceived in this way clemency is an exclusive prerogative of the powerful. As Seneca defines it clementia is "the leniency of the more powerful party toward the weaker in the matter of setting penalties" (89), not to be confused with forgiveness. While forgiveness seeks reconciliation, clemency achieves subordination, frequently producing public humiliation in its recipients. There are two high-profile ways of escaping the heavy thumb of the recipient's "patron," either by killing the patron, as Brutus did with Julius Caesar, or by suicide, as Cato the Younger did rather than accept Caesar's clementia.

Kristina Milnor points out that because clementia was essentially bound up with the exclusively masculine domain of Roman military and political life, women could be neither its dispensers nor its recipients ("Gender and Forgiveness in the Early Roman Empire," 99). Nonetheless, women could play an important behind-the-scenes advisory role to men in power. Braund and Milnor discuss the case of Livia, wife of Augustus, who persuaded her husband to try leniency toward the conspirator Lucius Cinna on grounds that harsh treatment had backfired against other enemies.

In "To Forgive Is Divine" Zsuzsanna Várhelyi discusses the promotion of clementia to Clementia, the goddess of anger management. Deifying Clementia puts pressure on rulers to emulate her. She seems at any rate to have had a civilizing effect on the deities. According to Várhelyi, "the main gods of the Greco-Roman pantheon were increasingly seen as passionless and benevolent in elite philosophizing discussions" (130; history does not record how Mars took the makeover). The balancing trick is to see how a truly passionless god can muster enough concern to be benevolent.

We come now to the five essays on Judaism and Christianity. According to Michael L. Morgan's "Mercy, Repentance, and Forgiveness in Ancient Judaism" ancient Judaic texts maintain that any sin is primarily an offense against God. Even so, human victims of these offenses are not to be treated merely as collateral damage. Though repentance and atonement should be aimed at restoring the sinner's relationship with God, these require, at a minimum, compensation to the victim. More than that, the sinner should seek the victim's forgiveness. Its being granted by the victim is "conditionally obligatory -- that is, due the sinner who asks for it" (145). Morgan includes a brief but provocative discussion of the question whether there are exceptions to this conditional obligation, whether, that is, some sins are unforgiveable.

The next two essays dwell on texts to be found in Luke. Peter S. Hawkins's "A Man Had Two Sons" subjects the parable of the prodigal son in Luke 15 to scrutiny, concluding that although neither son is a pillar of motivational probity, the father in the parable "forgives both sons without conditions and in doing so gives each an opportunity to become either more responsible or more gracious than he has been" (175). In "Jesus' Conditional Forgiveness" Jennifer Wright Knust discusses the vagarious history of Luke 23:34a, "Father forgive them, for they know not what they do." Present in some authoritative manuscripts, absent in others, the passage raises two questions discussed by Knust. What class of people is covered by Jesus' petition? Is the forgiveness unconditional or is it conditional on the repentance of members of the class? We can add two more. Even if repentance is necessary for forgiveness, is it universally sufficient? Is every sinner always able to repent? Knust discusses evidence that suggests that the omission of Luke 23:34a has been tied to anti-Jewish sentiment: belief that the Jews were guilty of deicide provides the motivation. And deicide, even if repented, is as good a candidate as any for the role of unforgiveable sin.

Ilaria L. E. Ramelli's essay, "Forgiveness in Patristic Philosophy," documents the career of the doctrine of apokatastasis or universal salvation in the thought of Clement of Alexandria, Origen, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory Nazianzen, John Chrysostom, and Augustine. One of the more beguiling arguments for the doctrine that everyone will be saved -- eventually, conditional on repentance -- hinges on the consideration that punishment must be commensurate to sin. Add the claim that no sin can be infinitely evil and it follows that no punishment can be infinite. The argument by itself doesn't deliver salvation, for it is compatible with universal post-mortem oblivion. The Church Fathers appealed to God's boundless grace to finish the case for universal salvation. Augustine seems to have parted company with his predecessors in rejecting the first part of the argument on grounds that "eventually" does not entail "without limit"; post-mortem repentance, according to Augustine, is impossible.

Jonathan Jacobs's "Forgiveness and Perfection" surveys some of the retrofitting required when one occupies an Aristotelian edifice whose landlord is no longer a remote unmoved mover but rather the biblical God. The essay's subtitle, "Maimonides, Aquinas, and Medieval Departures from Aristotle," is a bit misleading. Maimonides' views receive more nuanced discussion than Aquinas's. One opinion of Maimonides ties together some of the themes that surfaced in the four proceeding essays. Maimonides holds that forgiveness is conditional on repentance while also holding that some sins, such as the hardening of Pharaoh's heart, are unforgiveable. There are two accounts one could offer here. One is to maintain simply that some sins are so intrinsically monstrous that no amount of repentance is sufficient for forgiveness. The other adds the consideration that the very commission of these sins renders their agent incapable of repentance. Jacobs favors the second account as an interpretation of Maimonides.

If I were to claim that the modern concept of a wheel did not exist until the 1960s you would rightly regard me as having overly restrictive standards. Be they on chariots or Lamborghinis, wheels are wheels. To be sure, they have been improved over time, but their function has remained the same -- to facilitate ground transportation by minimizing friction. If the function of forgiveness is to try to effect reconciliation in distinction from the mere cessation of hostilities, we should similarly be wary of claims about its relatively late appearance on the moral landscape. There is reason to suppose, moreover, that it has been around for a long time among humans.

Part of my skepticism concerning claims about the recent inception of forgiveness stems from the semantic methodology employed in support of those claims. Here I will cite two examples. Recall Konstan's depiction of the Stoics rejecting forgiveness on grounds that it is incompatible with justice. It is hard to see how that depiction could be accurate unless the Stoics already had a concept of forgiveness, and equally hard to see how they acquired the concept if not from witnessing or hearing about instances of its exercise. A term will come to apply to a phenomenon if it is witnessed repeatedly. In this case the leading candidate would appear to be sungnōmē. Of course sungnōmē had other meanings. But if Konstan's depiction of the Stoics is correct, we have good reason to believe that sungnōmē already had "forgiveness" among its meanings.

The second example concerns the career of empatheia and its connection with empathy. Morton emphasizes the role that empathetic imagination can play in (modern) forgiveness. Is there any evidence for the claim that the ancient Greeks ever engaged in the kind of imaginative simulation exercise that Morton describes? As duBois points out, although ancient Greek recognized the noun empatheia, LSJ lists physical affection or emotional enthrallment as its earlier uses. No simulation is involved in these cases. At this point, however, she reaches her conclusion too quickly, assuming that because empatheia does not bear empathetic understanding as one of its meanings, the Greeks did not have empathy in their repertoire. Having appealed to Webster's New World Dictionary, whose first definition of "empathy" is "The projection of one's own personality into the personality of another in order to understand him better" (36), duBois overlooks the cognitive dimension of the definition. I suggest that in order to test the hypothesis that the Greeks did not engage in empathetic simulation we should examine uses of Greek cognitive nouns, beginning, perhaps, with epistēmē.

A more radical suggestion would be that the Greeks were capable of empathy even though their literature possessed no corresponding term. All the examples drawn from the literature surveyed in this volume involve protagonists with differential statuses -- quasi-feudal, militaristic, familial, imperial, or religious. Some of these literary sources are constitutionally opposed, so to speak, to entertaining cases of forgiveness. The Homeric battlefield is no country for old forgivers. Tragedies thrive on dilemmas from which protagonists cannot be extricated by acts of forgiveness. Other writings, such as comedies and parts of the Bible, accommodate forgiveness narratives naturally enough. What these sources omit are accounts of reconciliation relations among equals, especially equals of fairly low status. Those relations are not apt to be recorded because they are uninteresting from the point of view of classical epic, drama, and historical record, and because the participants are unlikely to have been literate. Could we have found forgiveness and empathy among those people? Contemporary game-theoretical simulation of iterated prisoner's dilemma situations has shown that colonies of cooperators invoking the strategy of tit for tat can thrive and resist invasion from defectors and free-riders. Simulation has also shown that an occasional forgiveness deviation from tit for tat can restore cooperation among participants. The participants themselves do not need to be literate in order to invoke these strategies. All they need is memory and an ability to suppose that other participants have minds that work pretty much as one's own does. Perhaps forgiveness was there all along, its quotidian ubiquity explaining why it is seldom mentioned.