Virtue and Politics: Alasdair MacIntyre's Revolutionary Aristotelianism

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Paul Blackledge and Kelvin Knight (eds.), Virtue and Politics: Alasdair MacIntyre's Revolutionary Aristotelianism, University of Notre Dame Press, 2011, 365 pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268022259.

Reviewed by Bernard Yack, Brandeis University


Revolutionary Aristotelianism? There's an idea that would have staggered the Stagirite. Revolutionary is hardly the adjective that comes to mind when imagining a thinker who defends private property and the patriarchal family, who locates the virtues as mid-points between the vices, and who criticizes legal innovation as an impediment to the habitual authority of law. But no matter how ill-suited this expression may be to Aristotle himself, it is quite well chosen to characterize the subject of Knight and Blackledge's essay collection: the later thought of Alasdair MacIntyre. And not just because of MacIntyre's well-known penchant for provocation -- such as his pairing of Trotsky and St. Benedict, the unlikely team of heroes with which After Virtue concludes. To be an Aristotelian, as MacIntyre understands the term, requires revolutionary resistance to the present order of things. For MacIntyre believes that the social relations that promote the Aristotelian virtues are incompatible with capitalism and the liberal bureaucratic institutions that dominate modern societies.

So Knight and Blackledge have provided their contributors with an accurate as well as provocative way of defining their subject. But they do that subject a bit of a disservice by identifying the "revolutionary" part of revolutionary Aristotelianism with Marxist ideas and aspirations, as if there were no other ways of rebelling against capitalist modernity.

[MacIntyre's] critique of capitalism is as strong today as it was in his Marxist youth, and it continues to be informed by Marx's insights into the conflict inherent within the capitalist mode of production. For this reason, MacIntyre's turn to Aristotle since his break with the Marxist left in the 1960s is best understood not as conservative rejection of modernity but as an attempt to deepen insights inherited from Marx's critique of capitalism. This reinterpretation of MacIntyre's thought . . . as a form of 'revolutionary Aristotelianism' . . . is now over a decade old, and this book is intended as a collective culmination of that corrective process (2).

This emphasis on reconnecting MacIntyre and Marx -- busts of Aristotle and Marx dominate the book's cover -- leads most of the volume's contributors to focus on questions about the compatibility between Marxism and MacIntyre's Aristotelianism, rather than on the exploration of what is unique about MacIntyre's "revolutionary" understanding of the Aristotelian virtues. MacIntyre's youthful commitment to Marxism lends such questions some poignancy. And many of the contributors -- an impressive group of philosophers, historians, and social theorists, which includes MacIntyre himself -- answer them with verve and insight. But if, as I believe to be the case, MacIntyre's approach to revolutionary change has little to do with Marx's, these questions distract us from a full appreciation of the former's ideas. In their zeal to rescue MacIntyre from the embrace of his conservative admirers, the editors of this volume may end up underestimating his originality.

There is no reason at all to doubt the sincerity of MacIntyre's rejection of capitalism or his sympathy for those who are damaged by its hold on modern life. That he certainly shares with Marxists past and present. But his understanding of the kind of revolution that we need to challenge capitalist modernity not only runs counter to Marx's, it makes Marx's understanding of human emancipation a symbol of all that's wrong with the modern world. Consider Marx's famous invocation of capitalism's destructive power, its dissolution of "all fixed, fast-frozen relations, with their train of ancient and venerable prejudices," its melting of "all that is solid" and profaning of "all that is holy." For Marx, this "constant revolutionizing of production" is emancipatory, no matter how frightening its consequences, since it breaks the ties of custom and prejudice that have kept human beings from fully developing their creative capacities as cooperative social laborers. For MacIntyre, in contrast, it is a perfect emblem of the moral catastrophe that has struck us in modern societies.

MacIntyre's revolution aims at recovery rather than emancipation. It is inspired by the belief that effective improvement of our life requires, first and foremost, our recovery of a way of understanding and practicing the good life that has been lost in modernity, not our liberation from the weight of past ties and our commitment to new and unprecedented modes of social organization. Moreover, what MacIntyre believes that we need to recover, a proper appreciation of the virtues and the social practices that generate them, requires that we repair and deepen the webs of connection and tradition from which Marx was seeking to liberate us. MacIntyre is no defender of established hierarchies, but his vision of social change is profoundly conservative in that it demands that we look to the past for models and work to repair social continuities disrupted by modern society.

MacIntyre, like Marx, wants to create the social conditions in which all individuals can flourish and develop, not just the fortunate few. Accordingly, the moral paragons invoked in this volume are of humbler background -- fishers and weavers and miners -- than the Homeric heroes and Aristotelian gentlemen discussed in After Virtue. But MacIntyre's path to this more egalitarian condition leads back to the local, traditional worlds that Marx treated as a barrier to revolutionary change. The centralization of production, which for Marx led capitalism to organize "its own gravediggers," undermines our power to resist social hierarchies according to MacIntyre. The dissolution of local ties and concentration of workers in large urban factories, which for Marx enables workers to communicate and organize, disables and disempowers them according to MacIntyre. Revolution begins for MacIntyre not in sprawling factories and industrial towns, but in Benedectine communities of prayer and among local miners or hand weavers defending their way of life against capitalist demands for more profitable modes of industrial organization. Some twentieth century Marxists, such as Gramsci, eventually came to appreciate the revolutionary potential of the local communities that Marx was so eager to undermine, as Blackledge points out in his contribution to the volume. But the gap between them and MacIntyre remains immense. For Gramscian Marxists local communities are an underappreciated resource for revolutionary change; for Macintyre their recovery and sustenance is the very point of revolutionary change.

We need to remind ourselves that you don't have to be a Marxist to hate capitalism, as Marx himself emphasizes in his critique of rival conceptions of socialism. The three truths about capitalism that MacIntyre attributes to Marxism (315) -- its exploitative character, its degradation of work and workers, and its subordination of the satisfaction of human needs to the highest rates of return -- could be accepted by a wide range of capitalism's critics. Given a chance to assess MacIntyre's revolutionary Aristotelianism Marx would have probably characterized it as a form of "utopian socialism," since it rests its hopes for change on the transformation of moral character produced by small, well-ordered communities. Or perhaps he would have criticized it as a form of "petty-bourgeois socialism," since it glorifies the work experience of the small artisan without explaining how that experience can be combined with sufficiently high levels of production to give us all a relatively comfortable life. Of course, it is entirely possible that a more utopian or petty-bourgeois approach to socialism is just what we need to change the world for the better. Indeed, MacIntyre embraces the utopian label, though he insists on distinguishing his "utopianism of the present" from the "misleading and corrupting" "utopianisms of the future" favored by Marx and many other social critics (16). But, in doing so, he makes it clear just how far his understanding of revolutionary change departs from Marx's.

In order to understand and evaluate MacIntyre's revolutionary Aristotelianism we need to set aside Marxist parallels and focus on its roots in his rejection of Enlightenment conceptions of human emancipation. The "catastrophe," to use MacIntyre's expression, that has struck us unawares in the modern world was produced by the Enlightenment's misunderstanding of the way in which human beings flourish and empower themselves. That misunderstanding shapes practices and social roles, but it is not their product. Consciousness proceeds being for MacIntyre, not the other way round, at least in modernity.

This kind of critique of the Enlightenment goes back as far as Rousseau, though it has been much more common among French and German philosophers than their English and American counterparts. MacIntyre's version of the argument has many original insights, but it still rests on the claim that grounds them all: that the Enlightenment's errors have somehow transformed the world in a way that has cut us off from the social ties that make for a healthy human life. Most progressive versions of this argument, like those pursued by radical Kantians, left Hegelians, and critical theorists, seek to recover and reproduce the lost treasure of past ways of life -- usually exemplified by the ancient Greeks -- at a higher, more self-conscious level that will also fulfill Enlightenment promises of human emancipation. There is nothing of that kind of synthesis in MacIntyre's vision of revolutionary change -- that marks another departure from Marx in his work. Social hierarchy remains a target for MacIntyre, but rootedness, tradition, received practice, in other words all the obstacles to human emancipation according to Enlightenment thinkers, are the means rather than barriers to revolutionary change.

How well such means will serve the humble in their challenges to social hierarchy is a question for activists to ponder. But it is important to note that the means by which MacIntyre seeks to empower local communities of weavers and fishers are also bound to make some uncomfortable with fundamental change. Coal miners who fight to keep their brass bands may be empowered by the local way of life that has grown up around their work. But they are also likely to become more suspicious of the prospect of better and more productive ways of life. It is hard to imagine how any serious revolutionary practice can do without some conception of emancipation from received traditions.

A broader question to consider is why MacIntyre believes that social criticism has to take such a revolutionary form. In other words, why do social critics have to go to the margins of modern society, to Benedictine communities of prayer or Trotsykite societies of rebellion in order to pursue hopes of social improvement? MacIntyre's answer seems to be that the power of the forms of life unleashed by capitalism and the Enlightenment leaves us little space in which to develop a proper, fully empowering appreciation of the virtues. But it is hard to see why we should accept this conclusion, given our everyday involvement in all kinds of virtue-promoting social practices. These practices may run counter to the theories of morality and emancipation advanced by leading Enlightenment thinkers. But that would suggest that there is something wrong with their theories about morality, not that these practices have disappeared from our lives.

Marxists can account for the singular, closed character of modern society by invoking Marx's theory of historical materialism. As we produce, so we are. Our families, our friendships, our associations, our imagination, are all shaped by the specific mode of productive relations in which we find ourselves. MacIntyre, however, rejects this way of thinking. He talks instead of the interpenetration of theory and practice. But if theory and practice interact and mutually influence each other, then it makes little sense to talk about modernity as the kind of singular, integrated entity targeted by critics who believe that the mode of production makes us what we are or that modernity is the product of a single theoretical project. It seems to me that MacIntyre's image of modernity as an integrated, monolithic condition only makes sense within Marxist assumptions that he has clearly abandoned.

For this reason I am not sure that the label revolutionary Aristotelian is all that appropriate for MacIntyre after all, even though he has embraced it himself. His Aristotelianism may be critical, unseasonable, alienated, and anti-hierarchical; it is not really revolutionary. True, MacIntyre would like to transform the character of our social world. But he would have us seek such change through means, tending to the virtues in our local communal gardens, which neither attack nor are prohibited by the powers that be. These means may run counter to the most influential modern ideas about morality. And they may be undermined by the power and rewards of social practices that promise more immediate and tangible forms of gratification. But there is still plenty of room within modern society to cultivate them.