Animalism: New Essays on Persons, Animals, and Identity

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Stephan Blatti and Paul F. Snowdon (eds.), Animalism: New Essays on Persons, Animals, and Identity, Oxford University Press, 2016, 334pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199608751.

Reviewed by Matt Duncan, Rhode Island College


This book will give you a great sense of the ongoing conversation about animalism. This conversation has been around for a while. So the trenches are dug deep; no one is giving a whole lot of ground. Yet it's still a rich and interesting conversation about a question that concerns us all: What are we?

This conversation is also somewhat messy. Not everyone is talking about the same thing. So it's no surprise that one of the editors' central questions for this book is, "What is animalism?" These days, the official animalist slogan is "we are animals". Seems straightforward. But it's not. The most common elaboration of this slogan is that we -- people like you and me -- are strictly identical to animals (human animals, to be precise). But many assume that animalism must be more than that, since, after all, it's pretty easy to find things that line up on the other side of an equal sign from us. I'm identical to a teacher, to a dad, to a guy wearing a red shirt. But none of this, by itself, says a whole lot about what I am in any interesting sense.

Plus, consider how much disagreement there is among defenders of the claim that we are identical to animals: Some say we are essentially animals, others say we are only contingently animals; some say we could survive disembodiment, others deny this; some say animalism is a species of materialism, but others explicitly reject materialism and even say that we have souls; some say that our persistence conditions are biological -- tied to our animal nature -- while others say it's the continuance of our psychology that's key to our survival (For an overview of the dizzying array of views on which we are identical to animals, see Thornton (2016)).

So perhaps the animalist identity claim, as clear and enticingly terse as it is, is not a helpful way to regiment this conversation. Fortunately, this book really centers on another claim -- the claim that we are essentially animals (with biological persistence conditions). So that's the claim I'll focus on in what follows. I'll give a brisk overview of how it is attacked and defended in this book. Then I'll discuss a broader theme about a methodology favored in this book, and offer a suggestion for how you, a potential reader, might sort it all out.

The Debate

This book's 14 essays are split into three parts: Essays criticizing animalism, essays defending animalism, and essays about the practical applications of animalism. However, the aim of each essay in the third section is to either defend or attack animalism. So, really, this book is a back-and-forth debate over the truth of animalism.[1] Most of the debate is over a few well-known arguments. In favor of animalism, there's the too-many-thinkers argument. Against animalism, there's the transplant argument, the remnant person argument, and the duplication argument. Almost all of the essays in this book focus on one or more of these arguments.

The too-many-thinkers argument goes like this: There's a human animal currently located where you are, and it is thinking. But, of course, you are thinking. So, unless you're identical to that animal, there's more than one thinker where you are. Which is too many. Clearly there's just one thinker there. So you're identical to the animal.[2]

In response, Lynne Rudder Baker and Denis Robinson deny that you're the only thinking thing where you are. They say there's also a thinking animal there that's not identical to you, but that rather constitutes you in the same way that a lump of marble constitutes, but is non-identical to, a statue. Sydney Shoemaker prefers to deny that the animal where you are is thinking. He says animals are not the right kinds of things to which to attribute mental properties. So he concludes that there's just one thinker where you are right now, and it's not an animal -- it's you, a person.

These responses to the too-many-thinkers argument will be very familiar to those working on this topic. But, on the other hand, if you're new to the area, this book will help you get acquainted with this part of the conversation.

The same goes for arguments against animalism. Here's a setup to the transplant argument adapted from Bernard Williams (1973) and Derek Parfit (p. 34):

My body is fatally diseased, as is your cerebrum. Since we have, between us, only one good cerebrum and body, surgeons bring these together. My cerebrum is successfully transplanted into your cerebrum-less body.

A lot of people think that I survive in this case, but you don't, since only my cerebrum, with my mental characteristics, survives. However, animalism appears to imply the opposite -- that you survive, but I don't, since, on animalism, we are animals, not cerebra. So it seems that animalism gets the case wrong, and thus, is false.

There's also a related worry for animalism here. If my cerebrum were transplanted into your skull, my practical concerns for my future self -- concern over whether I will get sick, win the lottery, get tenure, etc. -- would follow my cerebrum, not my animal body. Or so a lot of philosophers say.[3] This spells trouble for animalism, which would seem to imply that my concern should be for my animal body, since that's what I am.

Not so, say Jens Johansson and David Shoemaker. They argue that any mismatch between animal identity and self-related concerns shouldn't worry animalists, because identity isn't what matters for these concerns. Johansson argues that psychological continuity, not identity, is what matters. Shoemaker argues that we have a wide array of self-related concerns that track various, conflicting things -- some track psychological continuity, others track biological continuity -- but in no case is identity what really matters. Thus, according to Johansson and Shoemaker, animalists are off the hook when it comes to practical concerns.

The remnant person argument cuts at animalism from a slightly different angle. Suppose my cerebrum is removed from my skull, and yet is maintained so as to support consciousness. It seems undeniable that, whether or not that cerebrum is me, it is a person (in the Lockean sense). Most animalists would deny that the cerebrum is me. So it seems they must say that a new person comes into being when my cerebrum is removed. But, according to Mark Johnston, who first introduced this argument, that's implausible, since you can't cause a new person to come into being just by removing tissue that in no way suppresses mental activities.

Eric Olson, Stephan Blatti, and Rory Madden each respond to this argument in their essays. Olson lays out a range of potential animalist options, though he doesn't champion any one in particular. Blatti denies that there is a remnant person in Johnston's case. According to Blatti, whole human animals, not cerebra, think. So he denies that the remnant cerebrum thinks. Thus, he concludes that it isn't a person. Madden, in contrast, embraces the claim that a new person is created in Johnston's case. He says "there is nothing in itself mysterious about the possibility of having created an entity by 'subtraction'" (p. 203). He then points to a sculpture as an example where matter is removed to create something new -- i.e., a work of art.

The remnant person argument asks us to keep track of a single person. The duplication argument, in contrast, adds to the cast of characters, and purports to show that animalists miscount the number of people in play. Tim Campbell and Jeff McMahan describe dicephalus, which "occurs when a human zygote divides incompletely, resulting in twins fused below the neck" (p. 229). They tinker with the case, and ask us to imagine twins who share all of their organs except for their cerebra. Campbell and McMahan say that, in such a case, there would be two people, not one. But presumably, on animalism, there's just one person, since there's just one organism. Thus, they say that animalism gets the case wrong, and so is false.

Campbell and McMahan introduce other cases, as does Mark Reid in his essay, aimed at showing that animalism doesn't add up -- that it delivers the wrong verdict on how many people there are in certain scenarios. Paul Snowdon, on the other hand, defends animalism against this worry. He considers split-brain cases, where, again, it seems like there are two people but one organism. Snowdon argues that, in fact, there's just one subject of experience in these cases, and so no problem for animalism arises. Whether his defense can be extended to other cases, such as those introduced by Campbell and McMahan and Reid, remains to be seen.

The Evidence

So who is the victor? Or, to put it less combatively, which side in this debate ends up looking more plausible? Even though this book focuses on just a few arguments, there's a lot of conflicting evidence to weigh. And so, of course, I'm not going to weigh it all here. Instead, I'll address a broader theme about the evidence itself, and, in the end, suggest how you might sort through the evidence if you happen to read the book.

Many of the central arguments in this book, and indeed, in the broader conversation about animalism, rely in some way or another on what's called "the method of cases". This method appeals to possible cases -- sometimes rather outlandish ones -- to test our intuitions about what we are. Often we start with an ordinary person, then something happens to her -- her brain is removed or split in two, she is teleported, or her parts are replaced with robot parts. Then we ask ourselves what happened to her -- whether she survived and, if so, where she went. This is supposed to help us get a clearer idea of what we are and what we could be.

The method of cases is controversial. Some love it, some hate it. Many just use it without a second thought. One philosopher who does not like the method of cases is Mark Johnston. In his essay, Johnston offers an argument against it. He says the method of cases is only justified if it is used in the service of the purely a priori analysis of a concept -- in this case, the concept, personal identity. But Johnston says our judgments about personal identity cases are heavily constrained by an implicit commitment to substance dualism. And yet he argues that whether substance dualism is true is an empirical question, not an a priori one. So Johnston concludes that the method of cases is not useful for engaging in a priori conceptual analysis when it comes to personal identity. And since, according to Johnston, that's the only way its use would be justified, he concludes that the method of cases is unprofitable in this domain. As an alternative, Johnston suggests that we "resort to empirical means" and "use all we collectively know and all of our capacities for argumentative ingenuity to settle the question [about personal identity]" (p. 96).

If Johnston is right about the method of cases, then huge swaths of this book, and indeed, many other books and articles about personal identity, are up to no good. For, if Johnston is right, the arguments these books and articles propound are inherently defective -- they are based on a faulty methodology.

There are several ways one might push back on Johnston's argument. But I suspect that most of those who use the method of cases these days would converge on a pretty basic objection. First, they would deny that they're doing conceptual analysis. They would insist that they're interested in what we are (which is precisely what Johnston (p. 100) says we should be interested in), not what the extension of a concept is. And furthermore, they would totally and completely agree that we should pay attention to empirical evidence, and of course, use all we collectively know and all of our capacities for argumentative ingenuity to settle the question. They would just deny that this precludes our using the method of cases. So they would deny that the only legitimate use for the method of cases is in the service of a priori conceptual analysis.

Then how else might the method work? Well, Johnston says that some of our best empirical evidence about people comes from our everyday abilities to track each other through space and time. Fair enough. But, in the spirit of Johnston's admirable injunction that we use all of our capacities for argumentative ingenuity, I'd point out that those who started this debate about personal identity -- modern philosophers like Locke, Reid, and Butler -- all thought that we have an even better, more reliable, more certain source of evidence about what we are in and through time, and that this evidence is what most fundamentally allows us to track ourselves through space and time. The evidence I'm talking about is first-personal evidence.

To see how this might be applied to the method of cases and animalism, take another look at scenarios like brain transplants or remnant persons, and focus on what it would be like from the first-person perspective at the very moment when one's cerebrum is removed from one's skull or one's body is destroyed. Assuming (as we have been) that one's stream of consciousness could go on uninterrupted, it seems that the very same sort of first-personal evidence that makes me certain that I, safe in my chair at home, am now thinking this thought, would equally allow one to be certain that one is thinking at the moment one's cerebrum is removed, or body is destroyed, and thus, would allow one to be certain that one survived.[4]

This appeal to possible cases doesn't involve conceptual analysis, or rely on intuitions. The point of the cases is simply to draw our attention to evidence about ourselves that we already had -- namely, first-personal evidence about ourselves, plus empirical knowledge that a cerebrum alone can support thought. Thus, Johnston's call to use all of our argumentative ingenuity may very well encourage, not discourage, an appeal to such cases.

Of course, that doesn't mean the method of cases is problem-free. To be honest, sometimes I find the literature on personal identity overwhelming. There are so many puzzle cases, so many different scenarios that yield so many different conflicting intuitions. I don't know how to sort it all out. Yes, it seems right that I'd go where my brain goes, but, I have to admit, I'm also inclined to think there's just one thinking thing in my chair right now. What should I conclude? Add all the other cases and intuitions in, and I'm at sea. Of course, this sort of task -- weighing the force of one consideration against another -- is part of the business of doing philosophy. So some of it is inevitable. But the knot of intuitions regarding personal identity can feel so balled up that it's kind of like that gnarled fishing line you end up just cutting.

But I don't think we should cut the line. I think it's worth unravelling this knot. The solution isn't to abandon the method of cases; rather, it's to start talking more about the comparative evidential weight of each kind of case. It's to consider our epistemic priorities, and then order our judgments accordingly. I think some kinds of cases, and the judgments that they evoke, are way more forceful than others. For example, my knowledge that I'm now thinking this thought is especially secure. So if another, less certain intuition implies the opposite -- or would imply the opposite in a case where I had the same evidence -- I can set it aside.

This, in turn, may allow us to discard some of the cases that many find so obnoxious. We can shy away from very outlandish, far-flung scenarios, not because they invoke the method of cases, but because they provide less evidence than other cases. Would I survive conversion into a robot? Or metamorphosis into a kangaroo? Well, I've got some intuitions. But I'm not immediately certain. I am, however, sure that I'd survive so long as this thought is occurring. So I'll run with that.


So much for my take. Back to the book. Is it good? Is it full of new and exciting ideas? Well, there's plenty to like here. In particular, if what you want is to know what people are saying, and have been saying, about animalism, then look no further. As for novelty, these essays are (mostly) new in one sense -- they haven't been published before. Yet, they do feel familiar. Most of these authors have been part of the conversation for a while, and they're sticking to their guns. The arguments, objections, and replies are evolving slowly. So this is more of a knee-deep-in-the-conversation book. It's not a new conversation, or even a novel take on the old one.

That's not a complaint, exactly. Game-changers are great. But that doesn't mean it's not also valuable, even crucial, to engage in the slow, hard work of developing a line of thought, or an argument, or an objection, to see how it fares in the long haul. As I've already indicated, I do think it'd be nice to have certain aspects of this debate nudged forward with a little bit more force -- especially when it comes to sorting through the cases. But this book can serve as a useful foundation for that future work.


Duncan, Matt (2015). "I Think, Therefore I Persist," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 93, 4, p. 740-756.

Thornton, Allison Krile (2016). "Varieties of Animalism," Philosophy Compass, 11, 9, p. 512-526.

Williams, Bernard (1973). Problems of the Self. Cambridge University Press.

[1] For what it's worth, here are the two sides: Eric Olson, Stephan Blatti, Rory Madden, David Hershenov, Paul Snowdon, Jens Johansson, and David Shoemaker are pro-animalism. Derek Parfit, Lynne Rudder Baker, Denis Robinson, Mark Johnston, Sydney Shoemaker, Tim Campbell and Jeff McMahan, and Mark Reid, are all anti-animalism.

[2] Johnston points out that this conclusion doesn't entail that we are essentially human animals. However, many of the other authors in this book assume or argue that if we are identical to human animals, then we are essentially so. So they grant that the too-many-thinkers argument, if sound, establishes animalism.

[3] Some disagree. For example, David Hershenov (whose essay is mostly concerned with developing a four-dimensionalist version of animalism), argues that our practical concerns track with biological continuity, not psychological continuity.

[4] For a more thorough treatment of this argument, see Duncan (2015).