Annihilation: The Sense and Significance of Death

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Christopher Belshaw, Annihilation: The Sense and Significance of Death, Acumen, 2009, 258pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773535534.

Reviewed by Anthony Brueckner, University of California, Santa Barbara and John Martin Fischer, University of California, Riverside



In Woody Allen’s recent film, “Whatever Works”, the main character, played by Larry David, wakes up in a sweat and hurries down the stairs in a panic. He announces to his wife, “I’m dying!” His wife, obviously concerned, asks, “Now?” The character played by Larry David responds, “No, eventually.” It is natural to worry about, or at least to wonder about, death. That is, it is perhaps human nature, and, in any case, a general tendency among human beings to ask such questions as: What is death? Is it bad for the individual who dies? How can it be bad for this individual, given that he no longer exists? Is it possible to be harmed by something that takes place after one ceases to exist? Can we somehow “cheat” death and achieve significantly greater longevity, and perhaps even immortality?

Philosophers since Plato and Aristotle (and, no doubt prior) have investigated such questions. Epicurus and his Roman follower Lucretius made particularly important contributions to the debates about these questions. They argued, despite the common view to the contrary, that death cannot be a bad thing for the individual who dies because, as Epicurus put it, “When death is, the person is not, and when the person is, death is not.” Epicurus pushed a skepticism about the badness of death based on puzzles about the nature of the harm of death, the lack of a subject for the putative harm, and the timing of the putative harm. Lucretius added the following point. Death (posthumous nonexistence) appears to be the “mirror-image” of prenatal nonexistence. But we do not regret our prenatal nonexistence; that is, we do not in general regret that we were born when we were actually born, rather than significantly earlier. So we should not consider the prospect of our deaths at the actual time we end up dying (rather than later) as regrettable. Much contemporary philosophical work on death focuses on this interrelated set of issues.

In Annihilation, Christoper Belshaw gives a sustained and systematic treatment of these issues, as well as others, including the definition of death, the nature of human death, whether the fact that certain individuals die is a worse thing than the fact that others die, and whether more deaths are a worse thing than fewer. Belshaw helpfully lays out the most important issues and critically discusses alternative proposals in the literature. Often his critiques are compelling, and they are always worth careful attention. Additionally, Belshaw presents and defends an account of death that includes specific answers to the various questions posed above. The book is notable in part because it is chock full of argumentation that frequently calls into question attractive views that are deemed plausible (and defended) by other philosophers. Even when Belshaw is not entirely convincing, his discussions are invariably subtle, sophisticated, and illuminating.

Belshaw offers the following account of death: “it is the irreversible breakdown of, or loss of function in, the organism as a whole” (p. 1). This is a “biological” account of death and being dead. Belshaw rejects a view according to which a (permanent) loss of consciousness implies death, and he also defends the claim that the dead can still exist against those who say that death is the permanent cessation of existence. Much of the early part of the book consists in methodological reflections about definitions, criteria, and so forth. Belshaw is skeptical about our ability to give a strict definition of death, and, more importantly, he argues that this is not necessary. Whereas philosophers such as Fred Feldman conclude from the inability to provide a definition that death is deeply mysterious, Belshaw goes in the opposite direction, saying that “we know a lot about death” (p. 38). Belshaw’s view is that we really do not need a definition, since we have a serviceable general account that has clear implications for all actual and almost all possible cases. As he puts it, “We are altogether clear, in almost every case, whether someone is dead or alive” (p. 38). Further he makes the Wittgensteinean point that although we are less clear about fictional or imaginary cases, “nothing we say about life and death, none of the distinctions we currently draw, determine what we should say [about such cases]” (p. 38).

This point reflects Belshaw’s general philosophical orientation:

There is, more or less throughout, an insistence that we are dealing with words, rather than concepts; a wariness of both the need for and availability of definitions; a disinclination to assume that our troublesome questions are well formed, admitting of yes/no answers; and a skepticism about metaphysics. (Preface, p. xi)

In Chapter 3 and also a helpful Appendix, Belshaw argues against the brain death criterion. He argues that one can be brain dead and yet still alive, and one can be brain alive and yet dead. Belshaw goes on to argue against the Epicureans that death is often bad for the individual who dies. Here Belshaw opts for something like the “deprivation” account of death’s badness, on which death is bad for an individual insofar as it deprives the individual of the goods of life. Although Belshaw acknowledges the difficulty of the various puzzles about the evil of death, he argues that they are less pressing than they might appear (and than is often claimed, especially by the Epicureans and their contemporary followers). For Belshaw, the subject of the misfortune of death is “that person who died, who now allegedly exists no longer, and who, were it not for death, would be alive and in existence still” (p. 93). Additionally, Belshaw argues that the misfortune of death occurs in time; it happens “normally, when the person dies, and continues so long as, or for those periods when, were they not dead, the life they would have been living would have been good” (p. 93).

Belshaw concedes that there are complexities and mysteries lurking here, but he does not set out to address all of them. Rather, his concern is to tackle the view that the badness of death is special or unique. Belshaw contends that "death’s badness is something like the badness of a headache, and even more like the badness of a coma" (p. 93). Whereas the skeptics about death’s badness wish to emphasize the discontinuities between death and ordinary, uncontroversial misfortunes or harms, Belshaw (and the proponent of the common-sense view that death can indeed be bad for the individual who dies) emphasizes the continuities.1

Belshaw argues for two distinctive and controversial theses about the beginnings and endings of our lives. He argues that we could not have been born significantly earlier than we actually were, and thus that we are not harmed by missing out on an earlier birth. He also argues that we cannot be harmed by events that take place after we die; that is, he denies that there are posthumous harms. Although there is much to discuss in this rich and provocative book, we will focus our critical remarks on these last two theses about the beginnings and endings of our lives.

Start (out of order) with the endings. Belshaw contends, against Aristotle and many philosophers, that there are no posthumous harms. He gets to this conclusion in part by articulating certain “generalities” that, he claims, pertain to harm; then he applies these to death. The crucial putative general point about harm is that it involves an “intrinsic” change or condition, rather than a merely “relational” change. As Belshaw puts it, “Now plausibly, if someone is harmed they either undergo or are prevented from undergoing some internal change” (p. 131).

But it is not at all clear that harm only involves “internal” conditions, such as conditions of the body (or those that somehow “supervene” on them). If interests are (roughly speaking) relatively important features of our well-being or flourishing, then it is not at all clear why they would need to be internal. So, for example, the well-being of a daughter is an interest of her parents; presumably, the parents’ flourishing depends to some extent on her doing well. If their daughter were to become ill or suffer some other misfortune, this would have a negative impact on their flourishing. Certainly, one of the parents’ interests would be thwarted if something terrible happened to their daughter, even if they were never were to find out about it (or have any “internal” consequence of it). So, for example, if their daughter were to be injured or die in a hiking accident in Tibet and they were to die later that same day, the news from Tibet never having arrived, we nevertheless think that they have been harmed (during that last day) by their daughter’s death. Even if it is difficult to prove the point decisively, we do not think it is obvious that only internal changes (or failures to change) can count as harms. Indeed, this claim seems to be just as contentious as the claim that there can be no posthumous harms; thus, it is not dialectically fruitful to assume it to seek to establish the conclusion about posthumous harms.

It is interesting to note that although Belshaw accepts the contention that harm must involve internal states, conditions, or changes, he is apparently willing to deny that identity must involve only such intrinsic features. In his defense of something like Nozick’s “closest continuer” approach to identity against worries involving duplication, Belshaw claims, “And so it is hard to see how an identity claim could not depend, in some respects, on the existence of rival candidates and so, in turn, on other than intrinsic properties of the things involved” (p. 216). If this is so for identity, why not also for harm?

Finally, consider Belshaw’s claim that we could not have been born significantly earlier than we actually were born. He says, “Someone born at a different time would not, in one important sense, be me” (Preface, p. x). Let us put aside the qualification, “in one important sense”, as it will not be relevant to our discussion here. First note that we could accept the counterfactual, “Someone born at a different time would not be Christopher Belshaw”, without accepting the impossibility claim, “Christoper Belshaw could not have been born at a (significantly) different time”. The counterfactual and the impossibility claim involve different modalities.2 Put in terms of the possible-worlds framework, the counterfactual points us to the possible world closest to the actual world in which some relevant individual is born significantly earlier. The impossibility claim posits that there is no possible world, no matter how remote from the actual world, in which Christopher Belshaw is born significantly earlier. There might well be a possible world in which Christopher Belshaw — the very person whom we have grown to know and love in this world (or perhaps his counterpart) — is born significantly earlier than he was actually born. Certainly, it would not follow from the truth of the relevant counterfactual that the impossibility claim is true, because (on the possible-worlds approach) the world in virtue of which the counterfactual is true need not be the world in virtue of which the possibility claim (the negation of the relevant impossibility claim) is true.

Lucretius’s famous “Mirror-Image Argument” (mentioned above) raises what Thomas Nagel has recently called the most difficult and puzzling question in the family of questions related to death: the asymmetry in our attitudes toward prenatal and posthumous nonexistence. Belshaw’s discussion of this challenging set of issues — especially his critical evaluation of our approach to explaining the asymmetry — is nuanced, probing, and fascinating.3 Unfortunately, a thorough presentation of Belshaw’s critique and the development of a reply would be beyond the scope of this review.

Nevertheless here are a few preliminary thoughts. We presented the “Birthday Case”:

It is now 1985 and you will live eighty years in any case. Suppose you are given the following choice. Either you were born in 1915 and will die in 1995, or you were born in 1925 and will die in 2005. In each case, we will suppose your life contains the same amount of pleasure and pain, distributed evenly through time. It is quite clear that you would prefer the second option — you want your good experiences in the future.4

Belshaw says the Birthday Case is “bizarre” (p. 160). He asks, “How can we now choose when to be born?” (p. 160). He seeks to improve the case by offering the “Amnesia Case”:

You suffer from amnesia. The doctors know you are either Bill, who was born in 1925 and can be expected to live to 2005, or you are Ben, who was born in 1915 and can be expected to live to 1995. (Belshaw, p. 160)

Belshaw is skeptical about the claim that it is clear that you will hope to be Bill. As he puts it:

Most of us are not amnesiac. Our attitudes to past non-existence are not going to be those of someone in such special circumstances. What are our attitudes? We are not indifferent to prenatal non-existence. It is just not true that we simply do not care either way when this period of non-existence came to an end. What would such indifference involve? If we were indifferent, it would matter to us not at all when we were born. So it would not matter to us whether we had been born two or three hundred years earlier, or a dozen or so years later. It would not matter to us how old we were now, or what shape our lives had taken. But all of this plainly does matter. It matters both in that it has consequences and that we care deeply about them. (Belshaw, p. 161)

There are many subtle and difficult points to sort through. Here we can only gesture toward a fuller defense of our approach to answering Lucretius’s Mirror-Image Argument.5 Note that Belshaw’s worry can be put in the form of a dilemma. It may be that when we explicitly assume incurable amnesia in the relevant thought experiments, so that the past experiences are both inaccessible and inefficacious, we can generate the asymmetric result; that is, if the question is about a rarefied scenario, then perhaps we are correct to suppose that you will (say) hope to be Bill. So we could (arguably) explain an asymmetric attitude toward rarefied scenarios. Belshaw will now ask how exactly this result relates to the justification of our attitudes toward prenatal non-existence and posthumous non-existence as they actually are. Of course, as prenatal non-existence actually is, it is not a rarefied scenario of the sort envisaged in our thought-experiments (in which prior experiences are inaccessible and inefficacious). That is, Belshaw will point out that we cannot extrapolate from the rarefied to the non-rarefied cases. This, then, is a legitimate and pressing challenge posed by Belshaw.

Our reply to Belshaw is (in bare bones) as follows. We grant that in actual-world contexts we do in fact sometimes at least care about past pleasures and in some cases might well want to have been born earlier. We can grant this and still hold on to the asymmetry claim. That is, people’s actual attitudes toward prenatal and posthumous nonexistence are based on various factors, including instrumental values of the pleasures’ being placed at different times. We can in this way accommodate people’s ordinary attitudes while still embracing the preferred asymmetry claim. Our thought experiment cases are “purified” cases in which we can test for the asymmetry in question by factoring out irrelevant considerations — considerations that don’t bear on whether there is an asymmetry in our attitudes toward past and future pleasures as such (and not as parts of total packages that involve different amounts or distributions of pleasant experiences, or different life-contents). To do this, we must factor out any differences between the two compared scenarios that arise from different instrumental values; our cases are thus not so much “rarefied” as “purified”. Once the claim has been established by our pure and kosher thought experiment cases, we can go on to address people’s actual attitudes to earlier birth, later death, and past and future pleasures.

We can grant that people’s actual attitudes are by and large justified, but we want to ask why. To get the answer, we first go to purefied cases and note the rationally asymmetric attitudes/judgments thereby elicited. We can then argue that any actual attitude of the sort Belshaw describes in the quotation above can be explained in terms of the instrumental value of past pleasures in a manner that is entirely consistent with the asymmetry thesis about past pleasures as such. We have thus sought to defend a particular interpretation of the claim that people are relatively indifferent to past pleasures while also providing at least a sketch of an answer to Lucretius.

A relatively short review cannot do justice to the many fascinating and provocative arguments contained in this very fine book. It is highly recommended, even to those who do not wake up in the middle of the night in a panic about their (eventual) demise.

1 For a discussion of the division between continuity theorists and discontinuity theorists about death-related issues, see: John Martin Fischer, “Introduction: Meaning in Life and Death”, in Fischer, Our Stories: Essays on Life, Death, and Free Will (New York: Oxford University Press, 2009), pp. 14-17.

2 For a development of this point in the context of free will debates, see: John Martin Fischer, The Metaphysics of Free Will: An Essay on Control (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1994), pp. 87-110.

3 We first suggested this approach in: Anthony Brueckner and John Martin Fischer, “Why Is Death Bad?” Philosophical Studies 50 (1986), pp. 213-221, reprinted in John Martin Fischer (ed.), The Metaphysics of Death (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1993), pp. 221-229. Belshaw’s critical discussion is in his chapter entitled, “Asymmetry”, p. 174.

4 Brueckner and Fischer, “Why Is Death Bad?”, p. 219.

5 For a slightly more detailed discussion, see: Anthony Brueckner and John Martin Fischer, “The Asymmetry of Early Death and Late Birth”, Philosophical Studies 71 (1993), pp. 327-331.