Another Cosmopolitanism: Hospitality, Sovereignty, and Democratic Iterations

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Seyla Benhabib et al., Another Cosmopolitanism: Hospitality, Sovereignty, and Democratic Iterations, (ed. Robert Post), Oxford University Press, 2006, 224pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195183223.

Reviewed by Michael Blake, University of Washington


Cosmopolitanism, notes Seyla Benhabib, is a frequently invoked concept in modern political philosophy; it is a shame, therefore, that we so rarely define this term with the specificity it demands.  In this volume, derived from her Tanner Lectures of 2004, Benhabib gives a specific gloss on one particular variant of cosmopolitanism, identifying and defending a specifically political version of cosmopolitan politics.  It is an admirable vision, although not one without significant difficulties -- as discussed by her commentators, whose contributions are included here.

Benhabib begins with a tension within the world of liberal democratic cosmopolitanism -- a tension she believes can be mediated, but never completely overcome.  We are committed, on the one hand, to cosmopolitan norms of human rights, which seek to articulate a concept of legal rights that are universal and unconditional.  We are also, however, committed to a bounded notion of democracy, in which democratic authority is derived from the self-imposed nature of legal norms.  This tension, argues Benhabib, is of crucial importance for our political future; the tension between the universal and the particular, the cosmopolitan and the local, requires more serious analysis the more unified and integrated our shared global network of institutions becomes. 

The process of mediation, suggests Benhabib, might be accomplished through the integration of universal cosmopolitan norms into democratic practice.  In this, cosmopolitan norms become a part of the local, democratic practice.  The very transparency and egalitarianism underlying democratic legitimation creates a place for the universalism of these global norms of mutual respect and hospitality.  The process is described, following Derrida, through the logic of iteration; each repetition of the values of the universal becomes, in the particular instance, both a speaking of and a reply to the universal norms themselves.  More prosaically, this process might be understood as a form of negotiation; the universal norms are challenged and given form by the specific challenges of the local political community, whose self-understanding in turn is adjusted through the application of universal concepts in its political discussions.

Benhabib's analysis is centered around the figure of the resident alien -- subject to legal authority (thus, says Benhabib, a member of the demos) but not part of the community of identification grounding the local community (the ethnos).  The process of iteration, suggests Benhabib, can explain and guide our relationship to these problematic residents.  Her thought here is guided in part by Kant's comments regarding a "right to universal hospitality" (22-24).  This notion of cosmopolitan right begins to point the way towards an understanding of the place within democracy of the alien.  Benhabib adopts and expands this notion of hospitality, making it a site for the analysis of how cosmopolitanism might be used as a critical posture against the localism of domestic politics.  Respect must be given, she suggests, both for the democratic life of the people, and the rights of the alien within that people's shared life.

In this, she suggests that recent developments within the European Union can guide the way, as representative instances of the process of democratic iteration.  Her discussion focuses here on the voting rights of non-residents, and the relationship between French Muslims and the traditionally secular French educational system.  Both cases, she argues, represent an instance in which universal norms become adopted into the local legal community, giving voice to the traditionally alien, and making the demos more fairly representative of the universal norms guiding cosmopolitanism.  Thus, her analysis of voting rights applauds the decisions recently made in Germany to disentangle voting rights from citizenship status.  It similarly applauds the dialectical process of discussion between French Muslims and state officials regarding the place of headscarves within the secular school system.  These examples both represent cases in which the rights associated with citizenship were challenged, negotiated, and altered in response to the universal ambitions of cosmopolitanism.  The first case represents a clear example of this, in that political voice was there decoupled from political citizenship, creating a more universal and responsive community of voice.  The second case also represents the process of mediation, in that the dialogue created a space for the voices of young Muslim women to speak back to the state about the significance of the Headscarf for Muslims.  In these cases, she suggests, we find the beginning of a process by which citizenship as a concept is disaggregated and made more universal.  This, says Benhabib, represents the beginning stages of a new form of cosmopolitanism -- in which the legal rights of citizenship are rendered more universal, thereby severing the illegitimate linkage between demos and ethnos.           

This is a challenging vision, and it receives in turn three powerful challenges, which I will summarize here only briefly.  Bonnie Honig speaks back to Benhabib from the standpoint of "agonistic cosmopolitics" (117), arguing that Benhabib errs in her seeming acceptance both of universalist standards of political justice and of the state as social institution.  Honig suggests, instead, a more relentlessly political critique, in which all social institutions are subject to critical review.  Jeremy Waldron, in contrast, addresses Benhabib's institutional claim that modern European legal institutions represent a wholly novel form of transnational institution.  Waldron develops a competing vision, drawing on an alternative account of Kant, in which the fact of repeated encounter with foreign agents creates a positive duty to create legal institutions together -- a duty we have already partly fulfilled with the mundane set of transnational legal institutions we have already developed in areas such as communications and aerospace regulation.  These institutions, moreover, develop their own forms of legitimacy through repeated use -- making the tension Benhabib identifies at least somewhat less pressing.  Will Kymlicka, finally, argues that Benhabib has overstated the extent to which European institutions represent a challenge to an old-fashioned notion of national citizenship.  Rather than fundamentally superseding the notion of citizenship, argues Kymlicka, we ought to regard these institutions as taming citizenship -- rendering it more just by insisting that it is developed as a practice in accordance with certain universalist norms.

The volume concludes with a series of forceful replies by Benhabib to her critics; Benhabib admirably addresses the diverse arguments given against her central conception.  I will not, in this review, decide who has the better of the debates.  I will limit myself to two central observations: one stylistic, and one substantive.

The stylistic point notes simply that this is an exceptionally demanding book.  Reading it requires a basic working knowledge of European law, Kant (especially the Kant of Perpetual Peace), Hegel, Arendt, Jaspers, and Derrida.  Benhabib's own conception of cosmopolitanism is developed in dialogue with both Arendt and Kant, by way of concepts developed by Derrida. Analysis is made even more difficult by the relative compression of her ideas here -- an artifact, perhaps, of the work's origin in a series of lectures.  It is therefore probably best to read her recent volume on the rights of aliens and citizens prior to beginning this work.  The difficulty, however, also affects the discussion between Benhabib and her critics.  Fully understanding the arguments here requires one to be able to move more or less smoothly between the worlds of legal scholarship, analytic philosophy, and continental thought.  None of this is to disparage the work itself, which is worthy of attention.  Benhabib's conception of cosmopolitanism -- and the replies given to it -- merit close reading; I would only note that close reading here is more than usually demanding. 

The substantive point looks simply towards the limits of Benhabib's notion of cosmopolitanism.  While Benhabib is surely right to identify the institutions of Europe as interesting from the standpoint of cosmopolitanism, I would argue that she overstates their importance as a paradigm case for the future of cosmopolitan politics.  In particular, her political cosmopolitanism here includes what might be called a territorial parochialism; all the cases involve the integration of outsider into European residency, with the subsequent alteration of both the immigrants and of the nature of European politics.  Cosmopolitanism, however, requires a fuller accounting of what happens to foreign citizens living abroad who remain foreign citizens living abroad.  It is incumbent upon us to ask what duties Europe (and other wealthy Western institutions) has towards the globally impoverished, and what institutional sites might exist to help meet these duties.  In a more political vein, we might ask what the acceptable limits are of diversity in the administration of politics.  Benhabib seems to suggest that liberal rights are coextensive with human rights, such that all individuals have a right to institutions within which they are democratic citizens.  This is a plausible conclusion, but it requires more argument.  It requires, at least, some recognition that the political diversity within Europe is at least somewhat smaller than the political diversity in the world.  To suggest that Europe represents a paradigm case for what might occur in the global community as a whole seems to me quite unrealistic -- especially given the lengths to which Europe has gone to exclude some would-be immigrants.  If this is true, however, we need another set of cosmopolitan instructions, suitable to guide (and constrain) the foreign policy of Western powers in their relationships with foreign political communities.

Benhabib's cosmopolitanism, then, cannot be the only model of cosmopolitan politics.  It represents, nonetheless, an attractive vision of how a political cosmopolitanism might be developed; as such, it deserves to be read by serious students of political theory and cosmopolitan thought.