Another Mind-Body Problem: A History of Racial Non-Being

Placeholder book cover

John Harfouch, Another Mind-Body Problem: A History of Racial Non-Being, SUNY Press, 2018, 232pp., $85.00 (hbk), IBSN 9781438469959.

Reviewed by Julie Walsh, Wellesley College


At the outset of this book, John Harfouch tells his reader that he intends for his study to "engage and overturn the philosophy of mind" (xxxii). He aims to do this by excavating the "historical roots of a mind-body problem," which reveals another mind-body problem, a problem of, as Harfouch puts it, racial non-being (xxxiii). This excavation, in his view, displaces the traditional mind-body problem typically associated with René Descartes, which, as a result, displaces the traditional solutions to and the traditional experts of the Cartesian problem, as well as the resources that those experts command. In my view, he succeeds in this aim.

The book's most obvious audience includes Descartes scholars, historians of philosophy more generally, contemporary philosophers of mind, and critical race theorists. However, the consequences of Harfouch's work touch the entire field of academic philosophy. Indeed, I think it may be a must-read for all of us, especially those who claim a commitment to making philosophy more diverse. I will come back to this point at the end of my review, but first let me begin with an overview of the book.

Harfouch argues that "the other mind-body problem" is created in early modern Europe with the "invention of a hereditary and racialized mind-body union" (xiii). He points out that the way that early modern philosophers think about the mind-body union culminates in a theory, articulated by Immanuel Kant, that accounts for the union in terms of race. Harfouch understands Kant's view to be the following: the mind-body union is regenerated over time through sexual reproduction; certain physical attributes are permanently linked to certain psychological attributes; the two sets of attributes regenerate together as a result of sexual generation. However, Harfouch continues, because Kant takes only the physical attributes of the White race to be tied to the psychological ability to reason, and holds that the purpose of the propagation of humanity is enlightened progress, there is no reason for the existence of non-Europeans. Harfouch thus concludes that on Kant's view non-Europeans are reduced to nothingness; while they have a mind-body union, they have no being. It is for this reason that Harfouch understands the mind-body problem to be a part of White supremacy.

To advance his argument, Harfouch treats three main historical figures: Descartes, Charles Bonnet, and Kant. Beginning with Descartes, Harfouch argues that ensoulment, not interaction, is the more pressing mind-body problem in Descartes's system.[1] Therefore, if we seek a solution to the problem of ensoulment, we ought to be looking for a complete theory of sex and procreation -- and Descartes does not offer one. Harfouch's key text in this section is article 107 of Descartes's Passions of the Soul:

It seems to me that when our soul began to be joined to our body, its first passions must have arisen on some occasion when the blood, or some other juice entering the heart, was a more suitable fuel than usual for maintaining the heat of the heart, which is the principle of life: this caused the soul to join itself to this aliment and love it.
(AT XI.407/CSMI 365)

Harfouch notes that Descartes is clear that the mind and body are generated in different ways; a human body is created by its parents, and human mind is created by God. What Descartes does not do is offer a causal story to explain the union of the mind and body. In article 107, Descartes states that the soul is attracted to the heat of the heart, which is generated by the mixing of the seminal fluids. But Harfouch states that this does not tell us how the soul joins to the body when the blood is not spiritual in any way. Nor does it tell us why the soul joins to the body. He is unsatisfied by Descartes's claim, in article 107, that the union is a caused by the soul's love of the blood that causes the heat of the heart. For, Descartes does not tell us why the soul is disposed to love human bodies over other types of body, or why any one particular soul is disposed to love one particular human body. Harfouch states that Descartes does not provide a theory of sexual reproduction that solves the problem of the initial generation of the mind-body union. Thus, Harfouch concludes that the problem of the generation of the union is more "primordial" than the problem of interaction.

Harfouch ends his discussion of Descartes by posing the question of the racial legacy of Cartesian dualism. When Descartes is called on, in the Second Set of Objections, to explain how his notion of an innate idea of God squares with the fact that "the natives of Canada, the Huron and other primitive peoples" (AT VIII.124/CSM II.89) have no such idea, he responds that while such peoples might "reject the name, they concede the reality" (AT VIII.139/CSM II.99). Here, as Harfouch notes, Descartes could have just denied that the Huron has a mind. Instead, Descartes's response indicates that he holds fast to the notion of the homogeneity of human minds. However, this is not to say that Descartes's dualism cannot be put in the service of racist ends; Harfouch suggests that Cartesian dualism serves as a precursor to 19th century Aryanism. One could follow Descartes to the letter, as did French aristocrat Joseph Arthur, Comte de Gobineau, and simply redefine what it means to be human such that only White people have minds.

While Harfouch's treatment of Descartes highlights the fact that Descartes does not explain why the mind and body unite, his treatment of Bonnet highlights the problem of explaining where the mind and body unite. Unlike Descartes, Bonnet favors a theory of preformation to explain the mind-body union. Bonnet holds that the soul is eternally united to a bit of indestructible matter. This pairing persists through all cycles of development. Importantly, the pairing retains memories from each cycle, which, according to Bonnet, is what makes progress through time possible. But Bonnet does not offer an explanation for where the memory-packed soul-indestructible-matter-bit pairing is, and how the pair is reproduced. Like Descartes, then, Bonnet fails to offer a theory of sexual reproduction that explains his notion of the mind-body union.

The racial legacy of Bonnet's understanding of the mind-body union is more straightforward than Descartes's. For, as Harfouch explains, Bonnet appeals to the history of the species and articulates a view according to which certain peoples are essentially, necessarily, and permanently "backward." On his view, minds develop based on interaction with more or less stimulating environments. Bonnet takes certain environments, namely, European ones, to be conducive for the development of higher-order mental development, including self-awareness. Europe thus becomes the ideal environment for human progress. Because Europeans are themselves constantly progressing, non-Europeans will always be behind Europeans in development. There is thus, Harfouch notes, a profoundly political dimension to Bonnet's mind-body theory.

Given Bonnet's theory that non-Europeans are always behind Europeans in development, he is faced with the question of the reason for the existence of non-Europeans. Harfouch notes that Bonnet sees the answer to this question in terms of final causes. The final cause of Europeans is to become perfect. For everyone else, it is to occupy a place in the order of nature; non-Europeans exist to meet Bonnet's requirement that all beings exist for the sake of unity. The non-European, then, exists for the sake of the unity of nature, which, Harfouch states, leads to a "thingification of the not-yet-human" (90). Bonnet's line of reasoning is marshaled to justify slavery in, for example, Edward Long's 1774 History of Jamaica. There, as Harfouch tells us, Long argues that the reason that Africans exist is for enslavement. Drawing on Bonnet-style reasoning, Long suggests that the inferiority of African minds and bodies is "demanded by the harmonious unity of nature," and is "a product of God's infinite wisdom" (90).

In his final chapter, Harfouch outlines the manner in which he takes Kant to solve the problem that frustrated Descartes and Bonnet. Where Descartes failed to answer why the mind and body unite, and Bonnet failed to answer where they unite, Harfouch takes Kant to focus on when they unite. By focusing on the when, Kant situates the solution to the mind-body problem in the study of natural history and culture.

Harfouch states that while Kant came to see the traditional mind-body problem as unsolvable, he maintained an interest in the union but turned the question from interaction to how human beings persistently repeat in time across generations. Kant formulates race as immutable regenerations that persist no matter the environment. Harfouch argues that for Kant, it is a fact of sexual regeneration that both the physical and the moral/psychological traits associated with any race will repeat together with each regeneration of the race. Thus, physical traits like skin color are irrevocably tied with psychological traits like character.

The scope of the problem of racial non-being that is born of Kant's discussion becomes clear when we ask him the following question: for what reason do human beings regenerate? Harfouch tells us that Kant's answer, for each of the four races he identifies ("Hunnish (American), Negro, Hindu (East Indian), and White" (124)), is found in his writings on culture and history. For Kant, the reason for the regeneration of a human being is progress in the development of reason through culture, which requires that enlightenment be transferred intergenerationally. But Harfouch points out that Kant also takes it to be the case that non-White peoples are incapable of reason; their corporeal character is tied to psychological traits that do not include the capacity for progress and culture.

Harfouch draws our attention to Kant's treatment of the question of why, for example, Tahitians exist. Having no ability to reason, they cannot move towards enlightenment; why then are they here? Harfouch answers that, for Kant, there is no reason for the existence of the Tahitians. In reproducing, they reproduce their "own nothingness" (145). As Kant puts it, nothing would be lost if Tahiti and its inhabitants were to be destroyed. The Tahitians, indeed, all non-White peoples, are thus, as Harfouch puts it, mind-body unities without being (147).

This, then, is the problem of racial non-being. And, it's hereditary. There is no escaping the non-being for non-White people. Thus, for Kant, Tahitians are forever nothing while Whites march toward progress. Harfouch writes that "Kant invents a racialized nothingness," which, conversely, means "that Kant makes the principle of reason White property" (155). Harfouch is careful to note that while Kant's discussion of heredity and progress are "laughably outdated, the phenomenon those doctrines conspire to produce is as entrenched as ever" (157). Harfouch's suggestion of the continued entrenchment of the phenomenon of taking skin color to be tied to character resonates with the facts of racialized policing and violence in America.

It is worth noting one final point about Harfouch's discussion of Kant. In 1795's Toward Perpetual Peace Kant seems to distance himself from the claim of the nothingness of "native inhabitants," and commentators have seized on this text in order to redeem Kant. Harfouch states that there is reason to doubt that Kant did change his mind, but he does not engage with the potentially redeeming text in question, which may disappoint some readers. Some may also be disappointed that Harfouch does not offer a more detailed engagement with the secondary literature, since many authors before him have also treated the passages and theories he discusses throughout the book. Still others may wonder why Harfouch selected Bonnet as a mid-way point between Descartes and Kant. Harfouch does not argue for a direct line of influence from Descartes, through Bonnet, to Kant. If Descartes is the origin of the problem, and Kant provides its solution, we might think that Harfouch is on the hook to explain why Bonnet is relevant to the discussion.

As I understand his project, however, Harfouch is not interested in discussing whether Kant was racist, or whether he changed his mind about how he viewed non-Whites. I also do not think he is interested in outlining new interpretations of Descartes, Bonnet, and Kant; or in showing in detail the extent to which this trio of thinkers is illustrative of a line of influence of thought; or how his discussion fits into the secondary literature on either the mind-body problem or theories of sexual regeneration espoused by these thinkers. Instead, Harfouch focuses his attention on showing us a different history through texts and concepts with which many of us are familiar. Harfouch's contribution is to show the racial legacy of those familiar ideas; the legacy of dualism, of preformation, of the unity and harmony of nature, of progress and culture, of the concept of reason itself.

To follow the thread of the problem of racial non-being reveals a different history of philosophy, which, in turn, suggests a different picture of contemporary philosophy. Can we imagine what professional philosophy would look like today if we gave pride of place to the problem of racial non-being? What would our experts look like? What would our philosophy departments look like?

This is the very question that Harfouch invites his reader to consider. As he says, his main concern in the book is "the relationship between a regime of racism and the mind-body problem, the latter understood not only as a discourse but, more importantly, a job industry" (156). The implications of this different history are far-reaching. They impact decisions of pedagogy, hiring, and resource allocation. They would, among other things, work towards the goal of diversifying the discipline.

We live in a moment where "diversity" has become a buzzword in academia. University and college presidents, provosts, deans, chairs of search committees, directors of graduate and undergraduate admissions are increasingly concerned to promote "diversity." The word is featured in recruitment literature; in institutional and departmental mission statements; on syllabi; in tabs on academic association websites; on calls for abstracts; in job ads. Aware that in many parts of the country, the demographic of students (undergraduate and graduate), postdocs, and faculty (especially tenure-track) is heavily weighted towards people who are perceived as White, cis-male, non-disabled, and straight, American academic philosophy has joined the effort of increasing diversity. The American Philosophical Association (APA), for example, has many links on its site intended to promote the success of non-White, non-cis-male, disabled, and LGBTQ philosophers. The APA also publishes data about the demographic statistics of their members, as well as demographic information about our students. Yet, even a cursory look at this data shows how much further we have to go.

This raises the question of what we, as professors, colleagues, members of search committees, grant evaluators, writers of letters of recommendation, etc., can do to promote diverse philosophers at every stage of their careers. With respect to the question of racialized philosophers, Harfouch offers one answer: see and acknowledge that one of the central problems that has shaped and continues to shape our discipline, the mind-body problem, has contributed to not just the subordination of people of color, but an annihilation of their being. Then, we can work towards thinking what experts in the (other) mind-body problem would look like.


Descartes, René. Oeuvres. Edited by Charles Adam and Paul Tannery. Revised edition. Paris: Vrin, 1964-74. [AT]

Descartes, René. The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 2 Volumes. Translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985. [CSMI, II]

[1] Throughout the book, Harfouch refers to the moment of the union of mind and body as birth. It strikes me that Descartes may have thought that the mind unites to the body prior to birth, at conception or at some point after the material body of the fetus attaches to the uterine lining. In any case, Harfouch does not discuss why he takes Descartes to hold that the union occurs at birth.