Anselm on Freedom

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Katherin Rogers, Anselm on Freedom, Oxford University Press, 2008, 217pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199231676.

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of South Florida


In Anselm on Freedom Katherin Rogers investigates Anselm's attempt to provide room for genuine creaturely freedom in a world in which a perfect being is altogether sovereign. She begins with two chapters of general background. Chapter 1, "Anselm's Classical Theism," reads like a grab-bag of brief essays on Anselm's account of the divine nature, the relationship between Creator and creature, theological semantics, the problem of evil, and the relationship between God and the moral order. Chapter 2, "The Augustinian Legacy," is devoted to an exposition of Augustine's account of freedom and the fall.

After this introductory material, Rogers turns to the heart of the book: an analysis of Anselm's account of free choice. Chapters 3 through 6 consider Anselm's definition of free choice and its implications. Rogers argues that Anselm develops a libertarian account of freedom according to which free creatures enjoy a measure of aseity or "primary agency" by which they, and not God, are the ultimate originators of their own actions. This account, she argues, requires that Anselm back away from some of the stronger claims about divine power and sovereignty that are characteristic of what Rogers insists on calling "traditional, classical theism." Mere 'classical theism', Rogers tells us, "has come to mean the view that God is omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent" (16). (How 'omnibenevolent', a vile coinage with consequentialist overtones blessedly absent from the Christian tradition until quite recently, has come to replace 'perfectly good' is a question that neither Rogers nor I will address.) "Traditional, classical theism" -- the comma is surely wrong -- adds divine simplicity, God's moment-by-moment sustaining of creation, the thesis that "what God knows, He causes" (17), and an exceedingly robust notion of divine sovereignty, among other claims. Rogers's Anselm attempts to preserve as much of "traditional, classical theism" as is compatible with a libertarian account of freedom. In the course of her exposition she takes up a number of philosophical topics that are familiar in contemporary debates regarding freedom, such as the Principle of Alternative Possibilities, Frankfurt-style counterexamples, and questions about the intelligibility of free actions as the libertarian conceives of them.

In the final four chapters of the book Rogers applies Anselm's analysis of free choice to other theological and philosophical topics. In Chapter 7, she considers the relationship between grace and free will. She devotes two chapters to the problem of foreknowledge and freedom: Chapter 8 lays out the historical background in the work of Augustine and Boethius as well as the leading solutions in contemporary philosophy, and Chapter 9 looks at Anselm's solution to the problem. In her final chapter, Rogers explains the nature of divine freedom as Anselm understood it, arguing that for Anselm God is free even though he has no alternative possibilities, even with respect to which created world he actualizes.

Rogers appears to have two main aims in Anselm on Freedom: to illuminate Anselm's views by examining them in their historical context, and to make use of Anselm's views in addressing present-day philosophical debates. Unfortunately, she falls short in both her historical and her philosophical efforts. Her appeals to historical context fail to illuminate Anselm's arguments; they seem instead to be carried on in the spirit of "Who thought of it first?" And Rogers's interest in contemporary debates in metaphysics and the philosophy of religion leads her to find in Anselm views that simply do not appear in his writings. I will first address, briefly, the shortcomings of Rogers's historical enterprise and then turn, at much greater length, to the problems with her exegesis of Anselm as a potential contributor to current philosophical debates.

To begin with the first problem: Rogers devotes a good deal of the book -- about fifty pages of the 190 that follow the Introduction -- to the exposition of authors earlier than Anselm. It is hardly an exaggeration to say that all of this could be simply lifted out of the book without damage to the exposition of Anselm. For Rogers does not show, and does not even seek to show, that an understanding of these earlier authors is necessary for an understanding of Anselm: say, because we would misunderstand the meaning of some Anselmian terminology or misidentify the real target of some Anselmian argument if we did not know about the earlier thinkers. Her treatment of Augustine is particularly noteworthy in this regard. Again and again we are dragged through expositions of Augustine's views on the freedom of the will, the relationship between freedom and grace, the problem of foreknowledge and freedom, even the nature of time -- only to be told that Anselm's views were quite different. Augustine was a compatibilist, Anselm a libertarian. Grace, for Augustine, was irresistible, but for Anselm it can be freely rejected. And on and on. Why exactly we need to be offered so much detail on what, for Rogers's Anselm, seem to be the consistently perverse views of the Bishop of Hippo remains a mystery. (I can't be the only reader who will be baffled that, after Rogers tells us repeatedly how Anselm rejected Augustine's views on any number of subjects, she instructs us that we are to interpret Anselm as "Augustinian until proven otherwise" [194].) An even greater mystery is why anyone would think to use Augustine's views, which are murky and unstable and the objects of much scholarly controversy, to illuminate Anselm, who is by contrast a model of lucidity and consistency. Rogers's expository strategy is a bewildering case of clarum per obscurum.

If I might venture a diagnosis, it would appear that Rogers has yielded to the temptation to think of philosophical or theological disputes as generic "perennial questions." Someone in the grips of this temptation will think, for example, that there is such a thing as the question of the relationship between freedom and determinism or the problem of foreknowledge and free will. One can then mine an author's known sources for their answers to these perennial questions. Either a source will give the same answer one's author gives, in which case we have the answer to "Who thought of it first?", or else the sources will not contain the author's answer, in which case we can say that the author was aware of the shortcomings of his predecessors and developed his own view to overcome those shortcomings. But since we identify the shortcomings of those earlier views by means of philosophical and not historical analysis, and those earlier views are at bottom not treated as historically determined but as possibilities permanently residing in logical space for answering perennial questions, we don't actually need the history to make the case for our author's views. And indeed a historian in the grips of this temptation will not try to marshal any texts in support of the claim that the author is actually (consciously, intentionally) attempting to remedy specific defects he had found in his predecessors' views. It will be enough to show that our author's view does in fact remedy them. The exposition of earlier views thus looks superficially like history, but it is actually something else. It is philosophical analysis, only slumming in the past tense rather than the accustomed timeless present of logic. It is because Rogers uses her exposition of Augustine, Boethius, and Eriugena in this way that I say it could be lifted out of the book altogether without damaging the exposition of Anselm in the slightest.

The second problem -- Rogers's finding contemporary views in Anselm that the texts simply don't support -- is in a way the mirror image of the first problem. If a historian thinks of the questions we find in an author as nothing more than perennial questions, and of the available answers as nothing more than possibilities permanently residing in logical space, then why not go looking in Anselm for views that we find in contemporary metaphysics and philosophy of religion? It is some such thought as this that allows Rogers to find in Anselm Harry Frankfurt's hierarchical theory of the will, Robert Kane's theory of plural voluntary control, and well-worked-out answers to questions that had never even occurred to him.

Consider Rogers's reading of the two "affections" of the will. Anselm proposes that in order for rational creatures to have the power to act freely, God must bestow on them two general standing desires or inclinations, which Anselm calls affectiones: a desire for justice and a desire for benefit. One standard reading of the two affectiones, which Rogers calls the "Kantian" interpretation, is that justice and benefit are alternative objects of first-order desires -- "alternative" at least in the sense that willing justice is not tantamount to willing benefit, or vice versa, and further that it is possible for willing justice to conflict with willing benefit. (Rogers in fact saddles the "Kantians" with the view that willing justice and willing benefit always conflict, but this is a gross misrepresentation of at least most of the authors she identifies as Kantians, and I shall say no more about this red herring.) Rogers, by contrast, interprets the desire for benefit as a first-order desire and the desire for justice as a second-order desire, namely, the "desire to will benefits in the right way" (67). Justice, she says, is not something opposed to benefit, an alternative object for first-order desires; rather, "justice itself consists in willing to will the appropriate benefits" (68). The textual case for this interpretation is remarkably thin, and I can't imagine that it would seem convincing to anyone who is not already predisposed to find Frankfurtianism in authors from centuries ago. Considerations of length prevent me from making the case against Rogers's interpretation in detail, but I can at least identify a couple of pressure points at which it becomes quite clear that the Frankfurtian reading is unsustainable. The first is Rogers's explanation of the difference between the human will, which is free, and the wills of the lower animals, which are not; the second is her reading of a much-discussed thought experiment in De casu diaboli. I shall discuss each of these in turn.

An important part of Rogers's case for the Frankfurtian reading is her account of why, for Anselm, human beings have free choice and animals lack it. She lays out this account in the course of expounding Anselm's definition of free choice as "rightness of will kept for its own sake." She observes that the rightness of will to which Anselm refers in this definition is present even in the lower animals. She writes:

The horse which wants to go graze is willing what it ought. And the dog which loves its puppies or the master who is good to it possesses rightness of will. Clearly rightness of will here does not connote moral rectitude or uprightness. Anselm explains that lower animals are not capable of justice because they do not recognize and choose to have rightness of will, rather they simply have it by nature. To put this in contemporary terms, borrowed from Frankfurt, according to Anselm the horse and the dog possess and act upon the proper first order desires, but they cannot step back to a higher level and evaluate and endorse those desires. They cannot form second order volitions about their own desires. (64, emphasis in original)

But there is nothing about stepping back, evaluating, and endorsing desires in either of the passages to which she alludes here. Indeed, there is hardly anything about stepping back, evaluating, and endorsing desires anywhere in Anselm. This is a point that can hardly be overemphasized. It is an important part of Frankfurt's philosophical agenda that personhood involves a certain capacity for reflection on and criticism of one's own motives and desires. This is why Frankfurt will talk about persons as "identifying with" certain of their first-order desires and not with others. Rogers's book is full of such language. But this is simply not Anselm's agenda. Though no doubt human rationality as Anselm understands it does give us the capacity to reflect on our desires, Anselm never attributes human freedom to our capacity for taking up some cognitive or volitional stance toward our desires.

If what's distinctive about human beings isn't our ability to "step back, evaluate, and endorse" our desires, what is it? The two passages to which Rogers alludes in the paragraph I've quoted give two different answers -- or, rather, two different aspects of Anselm's answer. Anselm uses the example of the horse in De veritate 12 to draw a contrast between two different ways in which a creature might keep rightness (or preserve rectitude, to use the translation I prefer). Rational creatures can deserve praise for keeping rightness because they can "perceive" or "know" or "be aware of" rightness and can therefore will it; non-rational creatures such as the horse cannot know rightness and therefore cannot will it, so they are not praiseworthy if they keep rightness. To say that rational creatures can be aware of rightness is practically a tautology for Anselm, for it is central to his account of rationality that rationality simply consists in the ability to distinguish right from wrong (Monologion 68: "for the rational nature there is no difference between being rational and being able to discern the just from what is not just, the true from what is not true, the good from what is not good, and the greater good from the lesser good"). To be aware of rightness, then, is to be aware that a given action is right. This could mean that an agent believes of a given action that it has the property of being right, but it need not mean anything so philosophically fancy. The awareness of rightness could well involve a belief that an action conforms to God's will, that it is enjoined upon one by a lawful superior, that it honors God, or simply that it is what one ought to do. The important point for our present purposes is that the horse of De veritate 12 is distinguished from human beings not because he lacks a hierarchically structured will but because he lacks the capacity for beliefs of the form "I ought to φ."

So the horse example has no tendency whatever to show that the power to keep rightness of will for its own sake depends in any way on a hierarchically structured will. I turn now to the second example to which Rogers appeals in the quoted passage: the dog that "preserves rectitude of will … when it loves its puppies or its kindly master." Anselm offers this example in De libertate arbitrii 13, where he comments on the significance of each element in his definition of free choice as "the power to keep rightness of will for the sake of rightness itself." The dog enters the picture in Anselm's commentary on the phrase "for the sake of rightness itself." The dog keeps rightness of will, but not for the sake of rightness itself, because it keeps rightness naturally. This example would help Rogers's case only if she could show that Anselm thinks our capacity for evaluating or endorsing our desires is what allows us to act spontaneously, rather than naturally; and there isn't the slightest bit of textual support anywhere in Anselm for that notion.

I have gone into some detail about the horse and the dog because they reappear several times in Rogers's argument for the Frankfurtian reading. Consider another passage:

Nor is it enough simply to possess rightness of will and hence will what one ought to will. As we have seen, the horse and the dog can do that. The just will must step back and will that very rightness of will. 'Whatever does not will rightness … even if it has it, does not deserve to be praised because it has rightness.' The dog can will what it ought, but it cannot will to will what it ought. It can possess the appropriate first order desires which make it a good dog, naturally motivated to do what its Creator made it to do. It cannot possess the second order volition that it should have the desires which make it a good dog. (65, emphasis in original)

(Never mind that Rogers conflates the horse and dog examples -- which, as we have seen, Anselm uses to make two different points -- and even quotes a sentence from De veritate 12, which talks about the horse, and then applies it to the case of the dog.) The sentence she quotes is from De veritate 12, where Anselm contrasts the horse with a rational nature that is aware of rightness. As we have already seen, there is nothing in that passage about stepping back and willing rightness of will. Anselm's claim that the horse "does not will rightness" rests on his observation that "what does not know rightness cannot will it." In other words, the horse does not will rightness because, although it desires what it ought to desire, it does not know that the things it desires are the things it ought to desire. It wills those things, but not under the description 'right' -- or, as I suggested above, not under any description under which they are right -- because horses don't will under descriptions. In short, to say that the horse "does not will rightness" is not to say that it does not will to will what it ought, but to say that it does not will what it ought on the grounds that it ought to will that. As for the dog, we have already seen that the dog's deficiency is that it wills naturally. And again, there is no text in Anselm to support the idea that a capacity for second-order desires is what enables something to act spontaneously rather than naturally.

It will be helpful here to distinguish between two different senses in which Anselm uses the expression "will rightness" (and similar expressions). In one sense, to will rightness is to will what is in fact right. In another sense, to will rightness is to will something under the description 'right' (or, again, under a description under which it is right). We might speak of the first as willing rightness materially and of the second as willing rightness formally. I will rightness materially when I will to fill out my tax forms honestly (which, let's assume, I ought to do) because I fear the IRS; I will rightness formally when I will to fill out my tax forms honestly because it's the right thing to do. The fact that "willing rightness" can have these two senses explains why Anselm in one place affirms, and in another places denies, that a non-human animal can will rightness: such an animal wills rightness materially but not formally. (He affirms it in De veritate 12 and denies it in De libertate arbitrii 13.)

A second point at which it becomes clear that the Frankfurtian interpretation is unsustainable comes when Rogers discusses the famous thought-experiment of De casu diaboli 13 and 14, in which Anselm considers what would be true of an angel with only the desire for benefits and then what would be true of an angel with only the desire for justice. This thought-experiment, Rogers says, makes sense only on the Frankfurtian interpretation. Rogers writes that after speculating in chapter 13 about an angel that has only a will for benefit and no will for justice,

Anselm continues, in De casu diaboli 14, what if an angel had received only the will for rightness (sola accepta sit voluntas rectitudinis)? That is, what if God had simply given it the desire to will what is appropriate for it ? Note that, were the Kantian interpretation correct, the complement to the hypothesis in Chapter 13 in which the angel is given only the will for benefits, would be the hypothesis that God gives the angel only the will for justice and not any will for benefits. On my interpretation that would be an impossible hypothesis since the desire for justice is a desire regarding which desires for benefits one has, and Anselm does not propose it as a possibility in Chapter 14 or anywhere else. Moreover, the point of the chapter is that the one who can will only rightness has neither a just nor an unjust will, since he cannot will otherwise. It is possible for God to give a creature only the will for rightness, but in doing so He has not, and in fact could not, give it a just will. The case is the same as that in which the angel receives only the unqualified desire for benefits. Like the dog who has rightness of will naturally, the angel who wills rightly as a matter of necessity is neither just nor unjust. (69-70)

Rogers is quite right that on the "Kantian" interpretation, the hypothesis of chapter 14 is that "God gives the angel only the will for justice and not any will for benefits." Because on her own reading that hypothesis would be nonsensical, Rogers assures us that Anselm does not propose it. But she simply asserts that Anselm does not propose that hypothesis. It sure looks as though he proposes it, and Rogers gives us no reason to reject what seems to me and to many others the only plausible reading of chapter 14. To take just one example, it would be difficult to account for the parallelism between the will for happiness and the will for justice in the following speech on any reading other than the Kantian:

For just as, if he were given only the will for happiness, his will would not be unjust even if he willed unfitting things, since he would not be able to refrain from willing them, so also if he were given only the will for justice, his will would not be just simply because he willed what is fitting, since he would have received that willing in such a way that he would not be able to will otherwise.

And indeed, if the hypothesis of chapter 14 is not the Kantian one, what does she take the hypothesis to be? If (as she indicates in the passage just quoted) she thinks chapter 14 includes a will for benefits as well as a will for justice, then the hypothetical angel of chapter 14 has exactly the same volitional makeup that Anselm ascribes to the actual angels before the fall. But Anselm says that the angel of chapter 14 isn't and can't be just, whereas the actual angels before the fall were just and had the power to retain justice. Rogers is correct when she says that Anselm attributes the hypothetical angel's inability to be just to the fact that "he cannot will otherwise", but she overlooks the fact that the reason the angel of chapter 14 is unable to will otherwise is that he just has the one affection. Rogers appears to ask us to imagine a contrast between an affection for justice that can't help but will justice and another affection for justice that can will otherwise, but that's clearly not the contrast Anselm is drawing. Rather, his contrast is between a will that cannot will otherwise (because it has only one affection) and a will that can will otherwise (because it has two affections).

I have dwelt on Rogers's argument for a Frankfurtian reading of Anselm on free choice, not because it is particularly egregious, but because it is altogether typical of the way in which, throughout the book, she comes completely unmoored from the texts. To mention several other examples:

·    She repeatedly appeals to Anselm's supposed emphasis on the status of human beings as having been created in the image of God (11, 20, 56, 72, 83, 87, 106-107, 124, 201, 205). But in fact Anselm speaks very little of human beings as created in the image of God, and when he does, he invariably gives the notion a Trinitarian spin (Monologion 65, 67; Proslogion 1) that Rogers ignores. He does not, as Rogers often does, connect our being created in the image of God with free choice and its attendant "aseity."

·    She attributes to Anselm a "full-blooded free will defense" (82), according to which "free agency is such a great good that it is worth even the terrible price in evil" (91), though she cites no Anselmian text in support of that attribution, for the very good reason that there is no such text.

·    She has Anselm talking like a contemporary libertarian about habituation in the will (84ff, 103-104) as the means by which one can form a stable character for which one is then responsible, when there is no evidence at all that Anselm recognizes the possibility of such habituation and a good deal of evidence (particularly in the letters) that he rejects it.

·    Anselm, she says, "take[s] the truths of logic and morality to be grounded in the very nature of God" (150). She cites no text in support of this claim, again because there isn't one, though she does give an argument that would at best show that it's the sort of thing Anselm ought to have thought, because it follows from other things he said.

And I could go on.

Rogers and I agree that Anselm has interesting things to say on questions of contemporary philosophical interest. The problem is that in her eagerness to make Anselm a participant in present-day discussion, she has too often saddled him with the views of our own contemporaries, thus -- contrary to her own intentions -- making it unnecessary for anyone to read Anselm. I should argue instead that the reason Anselm is worth reading is that he doesn't say the same sorts of things our contemporaries say, in part because his problems aren't exactly our problems. How could they be, given his rather different historical circumstances? It is precisely because Anselm's assumptions, argumentative techniques, and conceptual apparatus do not map neatly onto our own that we can learn something from him. Anselm on Freedom represents a missed opportunity to learn from someone who does not merely say the sorts of things traditional theists say, or the sorts of things libertarians say, but who has a highly individual philosophical voice that can be discerned only by a kind of attention to Anselm's texts that Rogers unfortunately fails to provide.