Anselm's Other Argument

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A. D. Smith, Anselm's Other Argument, Harvard University Press, 2014, 235pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674725041.

Reviewed by John Marenbon, Trinity College, Cambridge


A. D. Smith's study is about three different versions of Anselm's so-called Ontological Argument, the second and third of which are considered at length. The first, discussed more fleetingly, is the traditional form of the argument, as proposed by Anselm in Chapter Two of his Proslogion. Even the Biblical Fool, who denies God's existence, understands the phrase 'That-than-which-nothing-greater-can-be-conceived (abbreviated henceforth, as by Smith, to 'G'). G therefore exists in his intellect. But suppose G did not also exist in reality; then something greater than it could be conceived, which did exist in reality, leading to the contradiction that that-than-which-nothing-greater-can-be-conceived is that-than-which-something-greater-can-be-conceived. In an appendix, Smith -- like most of those who have discussed the argument in the last thirty years -- dismisses traditional criticisms based on the objection that existence is not a predicate (or not a first-order predicate). Rather, he believes, the problematic feature of the argument is that it makes predications of non-existent things.

Smith gives much more space to the Modal Ontological Argument. This argument, loosely related to Proslogion Chapter 3, takes as its two premisses that a divine being possibly exists and that if a divine being exists, it exists necessarily and is necessarily divine. From these it can be shown to follow, in S5 and even in B (as Smith shows in two further appendices), that necessarily a divine being exists. Smith's evaluation of the soundness of this argument is brief and does not claim to be original -- he ends repeating the judgement of one of the argument's original modern proponents, Charles Hartshorne, that it is not 'self-contained'. Smith's main concern is, rather, to consider whether Anselm himself proposes the Modal Ontological Argument (something that has not in fact been claimed by most of the philosophers who have debated it). One obvious reason to rule out Anselm's having himself formulated this argument is that the passage in Proslogion 3 which suggested it talks, not about possibility, but about conceivability. Anselm's conclusion is not that G necessarily exists but that it cannot be conceived not to exist. Smith argues, however, that Anselm might none the less be putting forward the Modal Ontological Argument so long as he took inconceivability to entail impossibility. Some scholars, he goes on to explain, argue that Anselm's modal conceptions had no space for the absolute, logical notion of possibility and necessity used in the Modal Ontological Argument. But, after a lengthy discussion of their views, he makes a good case that Anselm might well have used the language of conceivability in order to talk about logical possibility and necessity precisely because 'possible' and 'necessary', understood within the broadly Aristotelian tradition he followed, carried very different implications.

Smith does not, however, believe that Anselm did in fact put forward the Modal Ontological Argument in any form. His arguments for this conclusion are many and tortuous, but the underlying point is that Anselm's thinking involves various metaphysical commitments about the way in which G must exist, for example, that it cannot be in time, and it must be without parts. Any reconstruction which takes into account this aspect of his thinking ends up looking very different from the Modal Ontological Argument, which makes no such metaphysical presuppositions. This negative conclusion points the way to the positive argument of the final third of the book, where Smith identifies and assesses the 'other argument' of his title, or what he also calls Anselm's 'Metaphysical Ontological Argument'. For it Smith looks to Anselm's Reply to a critique addressed to him 'on behalf of the Fool' by Gaunilo, a monk of Marmoutier. The Reply is full of interesting arguments, rarely explored by those discussing the Ontological Argument, but Smith in fact focusses on the one passage (in Chapter 1) which has received sustained attention from contemporary philosophers such as Norman Malcolm and Richard Gale:

Something than which a greater cannot be conceived cannot be conceived to exist except without a beginning. But whatever can be conceived to exist and does not exist can be conceived to exist with a beginning. Therefore, something than which a greater cannot be conceived cannot be conceived to exist and yet not exist. If, therefore, it can be conceived to exist, of necessity it exists. [Smith's -- excellent -- translation]

Smith's reconstruction of the argument here takes him, however, far from anything envisaged by Malcolm or Gale. It finally takes this form (p. 152):

1. For any essential kind of thing, if there is not, but possibly could be, something of that kind, then it is possible for something of that kind to be caused.

2. There could possibly be something divine (i.e. of the essential kind divine).

3. It is not possible for anything divine to be caused.

4. Therefore, something divine exists.

This argument is, as Smith says, valid. (3) is plausible given the ordinary meaning of 'divine'. (2) is a premise some might reject -- but Smith's general view of such people is that they should not be bothering to read his book. The weight of the argument therefore falls on (1), which is a formulation of what Smith calls 'Anselm's Principle'. Whether or not one accepts (1) will depend, he explains, on what sort of Principle of Sufficient Reason he or she recognizes, and Smith concludes by arguing that even a very weak one, which allows for the mere possibility of a reason for the existence of anything, will suffice.

Perhaps a philosopher of religion would form a very different impression, but to me, an historian of philosophy, Smith's book seems, despite the author's obvious intelligence and learning, a rather strange composition. The problem does not lie in any factual ignorance or linguistic deficiency. Where his argument demands it, Smith is able to command an impressive array of medieval and ancient source material, and his judgements about it -- as, for instance, in his discussion of Aristotelian modalities -- are usually sound, though he is not always up to date with the secondary literature (he does, however, oversimplify the issues on Aquinas and his contemporaries on the possibility of an eternally created world: he should read the fine discussion in Thomas d'Aquin et la controverse sur L'√Čternit√© du monde, ed. Cyrille Michon). He translates well from Latin and has an excellent grasp of nuances and ambiguities in Anselm's text -- though it is annoying, and perhaps to be blamed on his publishers, that he does not regularly quote in Latin as well as English since so much of his argument rests on fine points of interpretation.

The problem with Anselm's Other Argument relates, rather, to the book's aim. The most generous course is to take the aim as to establish and assess a new Anselmian argument, one suggested by a passage in his Reply, the 'other' or the Metaphysical Ontological Argument. Smith does indeed succeed in this aim, but he could have accomplished it without writing most of the first two thirds of the book. Even the third of the book dedicated to the 'other' argument is leisurely and digressive. Smith could have made his point as or more effectively than he does here in a twenty-page article. And, although he has propounded a new argument, it resembles various versions of the Modal Ontological Argument in that it forces the atheists, not to accept that, given premises they would grant, it follows that God exists, but to accept, not merely that God does not exist, but that necessarily he does not exist -- hardly the sort of a concession they would make only through gritted teeth.

Alternatively, the aim of the book can be taken as being to say something about Anselm. Such a construal makes much more sense of the many pages devoted to showing that he did not propose a Modal Ontological Argument and the evident attention given to connecting the Metaphysical Ontological Argument to Anselm's text. Yet this approach would not be a generous one because in any ordinary, historical sense of what Anselm did, he quite clearly neither put forward a Modal Ontological Argument of any of the sorts discussed by contemporary philosophers nor the Metaphysical Ontological Argument as reconstructed by Smith. Smith, indeed, accepts that Anselm did not actually state this position, or various others he attributes to him, but he believes that the arguments are implied by the text. Smith works out what arguments are, and what are not, implied by Anselm's text by a process of seeing, through ingenious argument, what does or does not follow logically from various positions stated there. There may be some quasi-legal sense in which the distinctions he thus draws show what is or is not Anselm's property, but they throw no light at all on what interests an historian, i.e., what Anselm thought. Argument, of which Smith is clearly a master, is never sufficient to determine what someone, even so great an arguer as Anselm, thought. What is required is a sense of historical and biographical plausibility, nurtured by a concern for history -- for what actually took place. And, despite his learning and his scholarly punctiliousness, Smith seems to have no interest in history at all. Historical texts give him the opportunity for an ever-so-clever display of philosophical legerdemain, and Anselm himself slips through his fingers.