Anselm: Three Philosophical Dialogues

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Williams, Thomas (editor and translator), Anselm: Three Philosophical Dialogues, Hackett Publishing Company, 2002, 110pp, $9.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-87220-611-4.

Reviewed by Christina Van Dyke, Calvin College


Thomas Williams has done an excellent job with Anselm’s Three Philosophical Dialogues, one of the latest offerings in Hackett’s Classics in translation series. Williams’s translation remains faithful to the Latin text while simultaneously proving clear and readable, and his introductory essay offers an intriguing (albeit unusual) means of understanding the project Anselm sees as common to all three dialogues. Since Anselm is a central figure in medieval philosophy, and since the dialogues—On Truth, On Freedom of Choice, and On the Fall of the Devil—present short, fairly accessible ways into his distinctive positions on such topics as truth, justice, free choice, and the nature of good and evil, the high quality of this translation makes for a welcome contribution to the study of medieval philosophy and theology.

In his preface to the Dialogues, Anselm writes that these three treatises belong together because they all pertain to “the study of Holy Scripture” (1). Each dialogue proceeds in the Augustinian style as a conversation between a teacher and a student, and each dialogue opens with a quote from Scripture or with a theological dilemma. On Truth opens with the student asking what we mean when we say “God is truth” (referring, most likely, to John 14:6, where Christ states, “I am the way, the truth, and the life”). In On Freedom of Choice, the student questions the teacher about the nature of freedom of choice, “[s]ince free choice seems to be incompatible with the grace, predestination, and foreknowledge of God” (32). Finally, On the Fall of the Devil begins with a discussion of I Corinthians 4:7, where Paul asks the rhetorical question: “What do you have that you did not receive?”. The teacher and the student agree that “No creature has anything from itself” (54). If we receive everything we have from God, however, including our choices, it seems difficult to explain how it’s possible to make a bad choice, and so the discussion focuses on the nature of the very first sin—the fall of the devil.

There’s an obvious sense, then, in which these three dialogues are relevant to the study of the Bible. Anselm wishes to guide his readers to a better understanding of Scripture and, thereby, a better understanding of God. The method by which he chooses to do this, however, is distinctively philosophical. So, for example, in On Truth Anselm begins his examination of the claim “God is truth” by discussing the truth of statements or propositions, since that’s the sort of truth with which we’re most familiar. After deciding that the truth of a proposition consists in its signifying that what-is is, or in its signifying as it ought, Anselm moves to address truth in opinion, the will, actions, the senses, and the nature of things. In each case, truth is agreed to consist in that thing’s being as it ought to be, or in its rectitude. Finally, the conversation turns to address God as the One Eternal Truth. We can now see, Anselm claims, that God is the rectitude that dictates how everything else ought to be. In chapter 11, student and teacher agree that truth is, generally speaking, “rectitude perceptible only by the mind” (20). This raises a further philosophical question, since (as the student points out) we often identify rectitude, or correctness, with justice. Justice is a subcategory of rectitude, however, in that it involves reason and will; in particular, justice requires willing what one ought to will exactly because that’s what one ought to will. The Anselmian definition of justice turns out to be “rectitude of the will that is preserved for its own sake” (25). Thus, a dialogue framed as an examination of the Scriptural claim that God is truth addresses philosophical questions about the very nature of truth and justice.

The other two dialogues follow the same general pattern: after raising a theological issue that needs to be addressed, Anselm concentrates on developing the metaphysical account he thinks necessary for resolving the problem. The three treatises are also linked philosophically; in the second two dialogues, Anselm frequently employs definitions and positions established earlier. In On Freedom of Choice, for example, Anselm rejects the traditional definition of freedom of choice as “the ability to sin and not to sin” on the grounds that God and the good angels possess free will, although they cannot sin. He claims instead that, when we examine the purpose for which we were given free choice, it becomes clear that it was given to us in order to will what we ought to will—that is, for the sake of rectitude of the will. Teacher and student agree, then, that freedom of choice is best defined as “the power to preserve rectitude of will for the sake of rectitude itself” (36). Thus, freedom of choice becomes closely connected on Anselm’s account to both truth and justice.

In the same way, in On the Fall of the Devil, Anselm relies on his previous discussions of truth and freedom of choice in order to better understand the nature of sin. He focuses on Satan’s fall because it puts just the right constraints on the philosophical discussion: unlike human beings, who face a variety of choices in a fallen world, angels are given one and only one choice, and they make that choice in a perfect universe. Since all creatures have what they possess from God, Anselm needs to explain how Satan was able freely to make a bad choice. To do so, Anselm makes an important distinction between the will for happiness, or the will for one’s own well-being, and the will for rectitude, or the will for justice. He claims that, although Satan had the power to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake, he willed what he ought not will by wanting something good—namely, his own happiness—but to a degree unsuitable for his nature. Finally, Anselm argues that Satan receives this choice from God only in the weak sense that God permitted that choice to be made.

Anselm’s arguments are often involved, and the dialogue format can make them hard to follow. The greatest merit of this particular edition of the Dialogues is the way in which Williams’s clear-headed translation helps the reader to track the thread of the argument and to see Anselm’s original point. Given Williams’s previous translations (see, e.g., Augustine’s On Free Choice of the Will and Anselm’s Proslogion and Monologion, also published by Hackett), however, the clarity of the Dialogues isn’t surprising. Williams has a knack for producing translations that both convey an accurate sense of the author’s original writing style and that read smoothly in idiomatic English. Scholars will especially appreciate Williams’s work on the Dialogues in the frequent passages in which Anselm’s arguments rely heavily on defining terms or explaining different senses of a word.

Take, for instance, the crucial exchange (mentioned above) between Teacher and Student in chapter 11 of On Truth, in which Anselm at last provides his definition of truth. In the recent (1998) Oxford World Classic’s Anselm of Canterbury, the Major Works (in which these three dialogues are translated by Ralph McInerny), the passage reads as follows:

T: Therefore, we can, unless I am mistaken, define truth as a rectitude perceptible by the mind alone. S: I cannot see how in saying this you could possibly be wrong. Indeed this definition of truth contains no more and no less than is needed, since the name of rectitude distinguishes it from everything which is not called rectitude, and by saying it is grasped by mind alone, it is distinguished from visible rectitude (166).

Williams clarifies this passage considerably by marking off the key terms with quotes:

T: Then if I’m not mistaken, we can define truth as rectitude perceptible only by the mind. S: I don’t see any way that someone saying that could be mistaken. For this definition of truth contains neither more nor less than it should, since the term ‘rectitude’ distinguishes truth from everything that is not called rectitude, and the phrase ‘perceptible by the mind alone’ distinguishes it from visible rectitude (20).

This consistent sort of move on Williams’s part does a great deal to increase the text’s readability.

Williams’s work with the Dialogues extends beyond the translation itself, however, and his introduction also deserves discussion. The essay seeks to provide readers with a way of gaining access to Anselm’s overarching project in the three dialogues by asking how we should understand Anselm’s claim that they pertain to the study of Scripture; to a large extent, the introduction succeeds.

Before I discuss what Williams does do in his introduction, however, I want to spend a moment talking about what he doesn’t do; namely, provide biographical/historical information about Anselm or summaries of the three dialogues. Interestingly, Williams refrains from giving even such basic information about Anselm as his dates (1033-1109). There are, of course, numerous places to turn for comprehensive discussions of Anselm’s life and works, but a brief comment about the place and the time in which Anselm wrote the Dialogues would help readers locate them historically. It can be useful, for instance, to know that Anselm is writing in relative philosophical isolation; what sometimes strikes readers as philosophical naiveté or lack of sophistication is better tolerated when they realize that he’s working these positions out, in large part, on his own and without the benefit of extensive acquaintance with previous philosophy. Also, although a discussion which related these particular dialogues to Anselm’s other works in a truly illuminating way would undoubtedly reach far beyond what’s appropriate for a Hackett Classics introduction, one might reasonably ask for at least a better sense of what’s contained in each of the three dialogues translated here. Although he mentions each of the dialogues in the course of his introduction, Williams makes no systematic attempt to summarize or to describe the individual concerns of the treatises, focusing instead on how to understand their role as parts of a common project. It would have been helpful, however, to leave readers with a better feel for the dialogues as separate entities as well.

What Williams does do in his introduction, however, is striking. He offers his reader a way into Anselm’s text by asking what Anselm’s purpose was in writing the dialogues, and whether his interests in writing them are the same as our interests in reading them. When we are reading the Dialogues, Williams writes, “we should want to know whether we are reading Anselm on his own terms or using Anselm to pursue our own independent interests” (vii)—that is, “using him as a resource for our independent philosophical purposes” (xiv). By asking this question, he raises an issue highly relevant to anyone currently working in the history of philosophy: namely, the importance of distinguishing between 1) addressing topics the original author found central, for that very reason and 2) drawing out of a text what we, today, tend to find interesting and philosophically useful. In short, there’s an important difference between, on the one hand, reading a text purely for its own sake or “on the author’s own terms”, and, on the other hand, showing what aspects of a historical text or theory are relevant to contemporary philosophical discussions and what contemporary philosophers might be able to learn from them.

At times, these two projects coincide: for example, the process of laying out clearly why Anselm rejects the definition of freedom of choice as “the ability to sin or not to sin” might lend itself naturally to a discussion of how his own definition (“the power to preserve rectitude of the will for the sake of rectitude itself”) fits or doesn’t fit with contemporary discussions of whether alternative possibilities are necessary for free choice.

Sometimes, however, those two projects split, and here Williams could have said more. For instance, Williams cautions that “while it’s often perfectly legitimate to detach [Anselm’s] arguments from their intended purpose and put them to use in answering our own philosophical questions, we have to realize that that’s what we’re doing, and make the necessary adjustments” (xiv). Realizing that that’s what we’re doing is easier said than done, however. As anyone who works in historical philosophy knows, it’s often not clear exactly what the author’s original purpose was, or when, precisely, one is departing from it. Developments in contemporary philosophy can give us ways of constructing a theory of truth, for example, which Anselm himself never considered but that seems strikingly similar to his in many ways, and then one’s left with the impossible question of whether Anselm would have intended to hold that position if he’d been aware of it. The nature of the “necessary adjustments” Williams mentions also seems rather murky. Williams glosses it as “[using] the techniques and arguments we find in the dialogues to develop Anselmian answers to even non-Anselmian questions” (xiv), but I have to confess that I find this suggestion rather opaque as stated. Given its importance and difficulty, Williams could well have spent more time explaining and developing this issue.

The moral of Williams’s introduction, however, is that if we are willing to “[enter] sympathetically into Anselm’s thought—looking at the philosophical problems through his eyes, with his aims in mind” (xiv), we might be made aware of “new options, new ways of posing questions, and new ways of answering them” (xiv). I find it impossible to disagree with that.

As a whole, Williams has produced an impressive piece of work in the Dialogues. I’m confident that both the introduction and the translation itself will motivate further study of the history of philosophy.