Anselm's Argument: Divine Necessity

Anselm S Argument

Brian Leftow, Anselm’s Argument: Divine Necessity, Oxford University Press, 2022, 317pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192896926.

Reviewed by Gaven Kerr, St Patrick’s Pontifical University


Anselm’s Argument: Divine Necessity is a sequel to Brian Leftow’s earlier work, God and Necessity. In Leftow’s own words, he takes Anselm’s Argument to be a sequel in a twofold manner: (i) because it develops the powers-based modal metaphysics he presented in God and Necessity, and (ii) because he uses material from God and Necessity to defend Anselm’s thought in Anselm’s Argument.

What Leftow wishes to defend in Anselm’s Argument is something that comes out of Anselm’s reply to Gaunilo. In this reply, Anselm argues that God’s perfection entails his necessity; in other words, if a perfect being exists, it would be absolutely necessary. The necessity involved here is absolute necessity; and part of the function of Leftow’s reconstruction of Anselm’s modal metaphysics is to articulate (and defend) this absolute necessity.

The first four chapters of the book set out Leftow’s understanding of Anselm’s thought. They include a consideration of the metaphysics involved (Chapter 1), its applications (Chapter 2), challenging problems (Chapter 3), and a reconstruction of the Anselmian argument (Chapter 4). Chapters 5–17 engage with alternative views of modality, and there is a very brief final chapter wherein Leftow re-states the Anselmian argument from perfect being to absolute necessity.

The position Leftow carves out in Chapters 1–4 is a powers-based metaphysics of modality and on Leftow’s reading, it comes close to the logical system S5. This metaphysics can be applied to explicate various absolute necessities such as those found in Anselm’s discussions of the subjectivity of all things to God’s absolute necessity. Leftow then considers some problems for this account of modality. Some problems are concerned with whether it leaves out any absolute possibilities and so is not concerned with absolute modality; for example, an absolute possibility that a finite being otherwise does not have, or the possibility of alternative pasts. Other problems are concerned with Anselm’s modal metaphysics as a whole, and in particular the charge that it leads to too much necessity; for instance, given the absolute necessity and immutability of God’s will, there is a kind of modal collapse whereby things that really should be contingent, e.g., some historical event, are in fact necessary. Finally, other problems are concerned with how to parse statements of the kind ‘necessarily, God. . .’ such that for any X that follows this statement, the necessity is such that anything that could render that statement false is prevented; but this is odd since it locates God’s absolute necessity in some other thing’s being prevented and not within God Himself. In his discussion of these challenges, Leftow articulates some subtle (and difficult) moves that the defender of Anselm could make. Finally in Chapter 4 Leftow presents and formalises Anselm’s reply to Gaunilo, wherein he argues to the conclusion that that than which nothing greater can be thought cannot not exist. The remaining chapters of the book take up the defence of this argument by considering different challenges thereto.

There are over 10 chapters wherein Leftow sets out alternative challenges to the Anselmian argument. Some of these chapters focus on individual philosophers, both historical and contemporary: Hume, Kant, and Richard Swinburne. In considering Hume and Kant, Leftow notes how in the hands of these philosophers, modal claims, particularly claims about necessity, pertain not to existentials, but to concepts or propositions. Accordingly, necessity is attributed when its contrary implies a contradiction, and this pertains to conceptual contents, not to existents; for it can never be contradictory to imagine the non-existence of an existent. This is an outlook taken up again by Swinburne, who argues that absolute modality is bound up with contradiction, such that something is absolutely possible if it entails no contradiction. God’s non-existence entails no contradiction unless good arguments have been offered to show that it does so, i.e., unless arguments have been offered to show that God’s existence is absolutely necessary such that His non-existence would entail a contradiction. But, Swinburne claims, there are no such arguments, in which case it is possible that God not exist, which is to say that He is not absolutely necessary.

The nerve of this argument is clearly Swinburne’s view that there are no arguments that show that God’s non-existence entails a contradiction.. Swinburne undertakes to show that all arguments from perfection, or ontological arguments, are unsound. One such attempt is as follows. The premises of any ontological argument both entail the existence of God and provide a reason why He exists. But in that case, God is dependent for His existence on the reasons supplied by the premises of the ontological argument, including the metaphysical principles therein. Hence, it is the metaphysical principles of the premises of the ontological argument that are more fundamental than God.

The problem here is that Swinburne has confused the order of knowing with the order of being. Knowing that a thing exists by means of its effects does not entail that a thing exists because of its effects; for the effects simply provide us with a reasonable justification for the belief that the thing exists. They themselves do not explain the being of the thing. Similarly with our knowledge of God’s existence by means of the ontological argument; the premises of such argumentation and the metaphysical principles employed therein may justify our belief that God exists, but they do not themselves condition the existence of God in such a way that He is dependent on such principles.  God can remain prior in the order of being, whereas the premises and metaphysical principles of the arguments are prior in the order of knowing.

Of the remaining chapters, some focus on more systematic issues brought up within the Anselmian argument itself rather than on how it fares in relation to other historical thinkers. For instance, several chapters take up the challenge that if there could have been nothing concrete, and given that a perfect being is concrete, then such a perfect being could not be necessary since there could have been nothing concrete (including this perfect being). Other chapters consider perfect being contingency and ask whether a perfect being could exist contingently. In all of these chapters, Leftow considers some intricate moves in metaphysics, epistemology, and modal logic. And in each case, he argues that the absolute necessity pertaining to the perfect being of Anselm’s thought comes out on top.

As the reader may surmise, there is quite a lot of material in Leftow’s book that must be passed over in a review such as this. Even from what has been said so far, however,, it should be clear that Leftow undertakes a difficult and tricky challenge in re-constructing St Anselm’s modal thought within the context of contemporary philosophy, particularly given developments made in modal logic and metaphysics in the intervening centuries. And this is the unique contribution of this book: it provides a thorough and robust defence of Anselm within the language, categories, and context of contemporary analytic philosophy. Not only that, there are many other positive aspects of the book available to the reader. What stood out to me was not only how relevant St Anselm’s thought is for contemporary philosophy, but also how its nuances allow it to deal with delicate problems in modal metaphysics that are an ongoing concern.

All of this speaks to the value of the book, and I want the reader of this review to bear that in mind. However, the book does have some negative aspects, three of which I think should be highlighted.

The first thing to say is that this is not an easy book. As Leftow remarks at the beginning of the work, it is written for analytic philosophers, and so one must not only be relatively familiar with recent discussions in analytical philosophy, but intimately so. This, however, is not why this  is a difficult work. Philosophers are accustomed to dealing with difficult subject matter; but when a  subject matter is difficult, the philosopher ought not to make it even more difficult in his mode of presentation. Unfortunately, Leftow’s manner of presentation of this material makes an already difficult subject matter worse. His style is somewhat difficult and confusing, and material that need not be confusing is presented in a confusing manner.

Furthermore, it was difficult to discern a clear structure to the book; the first four chapters deal with St Anselm’s views on modality and present an Anselmian modal logic and metaphysics. These chapters represent a clear unit with a visible connection. But the remaining chapters are somewhat random and do not show any clear progression. In one way or another they all defend the Anselmian position adopted by Leftow, but it is not clear why later chapters appear later, and earlier chapters appear earlier. Hence, there is no clear map through the book.

A final issue I had with the book is that when supplying buttressing references, Leftow frequently cites entire works or works of his own that have not yet been published. Indeed, on numerous occasions Leftow justifies himself by appeal to a work on Anselm’s proof of God which, whilst forthcoming, has not yet appeared. One could say that this is only a problem for anyone  reading this book now, rather than  later; but even someone reading the book later will have difficulty, since when appealing to his forthcoming work, it is unclear to what part of it Leftow is appealing.

Whilst not denying the merits of the position Leftow adopts and defends in this book, I do think the foregoing issues affect the book, and so one interested in a contemporary presentation and defence of Anselmian thought ought to approach this work with care. Nevertheless, for the professional philosopher, this book provides a detailed and robustly defended Anselmian account of perfect being necessity against challenges that have emerged in the history of philosophy after St Anselm.