Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View

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Immanuel Kant, Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, ed., trans. Robert Louden, intro. Manfred Kuehn, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 246pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 052185556X.

Reviewed by Frederick Rauscher, Michigan State University


I assume that some readers of this review will have just found out that Immanuel Kant wrote a book on anthropology.  But for students at the Albertus Universität in Königsberg, anthropology was likely to be their first, if not only, exposure to Kant's thought.  For almost 25 years Kant offered a lecture course on anthropology every winter semester, alternating with his lecture course on physical geography every summer semester, to provide students with an overview of the knowledge of nature and the knowledge of humanity.  Kant considered his anthropology to be a simple introductory level course -- you won't find the word "transcendental" anywhere in this book -- and despite the fact that Kant charged a fee to students taking the course it was one of his most popular courses, judging from descriptions and from the number of surviving sets of student lecture notes.  After his retirement from teaching in 1796, Kant sifted through his lecture notes to compile this book, which he calls "the present manual for my anthropology course" (6).  It contains the final form of that course.

But the story is not that simple.  The Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View is not an introductory overview of Kant's philosophy; instead it plays various roles in his system that evolved along with Kant's thought.  Manfred Kuehn's helpful introduction to this volume surveys the development of these various roles over time, but I will sum them up as follows:  First, the Anthropology came to contain Kant's empirical psychology after he had determined that metaphysics had nothing to contribute to psychology in its current form as "rational psychology".  Second, the Anthropology contains Kant's empirical ethics in that it provides knowledge necessary for application of the categorical imperative to actual human life.  Third, the Anthropology has a special material of its own.  It is in this sense that Kant says that anthropology, which answers the question "what is the human being", is the highest of all the disciplines.  This last is perhaps the most vague of all. 

The first of these roles derives from the fact that, by the time of the Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, Kant had determined that rational psychology cannot explain the phenomenal nature of human beings, so he soon began to lecture on human being known as phenomenon in nature.  In the Critique of Pure Reason Kant had divided the metaphysics of nature into two parts: study of corporeal nature and study of thinking nature.  Five years later, in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Kant argued that there could be no proper natural science of psychology, citing lack of mathematizability and lack of objectively available data; hence there is no Metaphysical Foundations of Psychology.  The discipline of psychology, then, is only descriptive, and is found in the study of empirical human being, i.e. in anthropology.  The first part, the "Anthropology Didactic," serves this purpose.  This part of the Anthropology covers the nature of the senses, imagination, memory, the understanding, judgment, and reason, with regard to their actual use and to the problems that can arise for them through diseases or misapplication.  Additionally, the faculty of desire receives attention (and here we get the explanation of the differences between passions and affects and their role in determining action) as does the faculty of pleasure (providing some aesthetic considerations).

The second role of Anthropology is hinted at in the "Preface" to the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals.  There the empirical part of ethics is called "practical anthropology", analogous to empirical physics and consists of "philosophy insofar as it is based on grounds of experience."  This empirical part of ethics is not supposed to provide the ground for duty but to provide information to help individuals determine duties.  What Kant has in mind is never spelled out, but it would include specific knowledge of human beings to learn how better to motivate themselves to duty and how to judge particular individual duties in light of actual cultural and other related differences among individuals.  As Kuehn notes, only a tiny part of the published Anthropology contains this material, and overall Kant "never completed" the project (xxiv).  The word "pragmatic" rather than "practical" in the title reveals that Kant believed that his Anthropology went beyond this purpose.  Presumably the second main part, "Anthropology Characteristic," is to be understood along these lines, particularly with regard to the discussion of individual character, but also with regard to characters of the sexes, and of peoples.  An example of how this would work is given in the section on the influence of intoxicating food and beverages on the cognitive powers (62-65).  Intemperance can be "rude" and thus a "mistake," yet the drinker is not always to blame, for sometimes the host "desires that the guest leave fully satisfied."  The lack of care when intoxicated can be nature's way of restoring power to someone so he can face life's challenges.  Drink can be an aid to frankness, a morally desirable quality.  Kant also concludes that individuals' characters ought not be judged when they are drunk because rather than revealing one's true character, drink introduces another one.  An important point to notice here is that this example comes not from the "Characteristic" but from the "Didactic", i.e. from the part corresponding to empirical psychology.  One of the many lessons one can learn from the Anthropology is that at the empirical level of application, there is no sharp dividing line between morality and nature, since empirical psychology can function as empirical ethics for this purpose.  Human beings in nature are acting, moral beings. 

For the third role of the Anthropology, consider Kant's famous list of four questions from his Logic.  Philosophy "in a cosmopolitan sense" is summed up by "What can I know?," "What ought I to do?," "What may I hope?," and "What is the human being?"  The first three questions all relate to the last one, so Kant concludes "we could reckon all of this as anthropology" (9:25).  In the preface to the published Anthropology, he calls anthropology "knowledge of the world" concerning what the human being "as a free-acting being makes of himself, or can and should make of himself," or more to the point, the human being as "citizen of the world" (3-4).  Here the section "the character of the species" -- the final section of the book -- is most appropriate.  It places the nature of the human being in the context of morality and the destiny of humanity with regard to freedom.  Kant refers in this section to the need for the human species as a whole to educate itself in order to bring about progress.  In this rather neat way Kant concludes the course by reminding his students of the value of what they have just learned.  What is interesting about this third role is how general it is.  Rather than restricting anthropology to a supporting role as empirical psychology or empirical ethics, Kant broadly defines anthropology as central to philosophy.  Unfortunately he offers more rhetoric than substance in this regard. 

Kant scholars have had only a decade to learn about the complex nature of Kant's Anthropology.  The German two-part volume of student notes from Kant's lectures on anthropology, published in Kants gesammelte Schriften only in 1997, contains course notes from as early as 1772 and as late as 1789.  The publication of these course notes sparked a spate of studies of the topics contained in Kant's work on anthropology.  More has been learned, for example, about Kant's determinism as applied to the human power of choice as an empirical faculty.  The volume under review, a new translation of the Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View as published by Kant in 1798, now provides a critical edition fitting the renewed attention to these topics.  Robert Louden's translation and critical apparatus are superior to the two previous translations into English, not that there's anything wrong with them.  This translation will also be included in a forthcoming Anthropology, History, and Education volume in the series The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant.  Louden, along with Allen Wood, is also working on a volume Lectures on Anthropology for that series, to contain several of the student course notes.  All this material will provide an excellent opening into the ways that Kant approached the study of human beings empirically. 

Louden's edition combines the best parts of the two previous English translations, with the philosophical accuracy of Mary Gregor (The Hague:  Martinus Nijhoff [now Springer], 1974) and the extensive use of manuscript materials of Victor Lyle Dowdell (Carbondale, University of Southern Illinois Press, 1978).  The manuscript, Kant's Handschrift, is a complete version of the book in Kant's own hand now housed at the University Library in Rostock.  This is the only complete handwritten manuscript of any of Kant's books.  The standard German edition of the Anthropology, in Volume VII of Kants gesammelte Schriften (KGS), provides the variants from that manuscript as well as changes between the two editions published in Kant's lifetime.  Gregor's use of the manuscript is sparing while Dowdell's is extensive but unhelpfully appended as endnotes at the end of the book, in contrast to Louden, who places them at the foot of the page.  The edition under review here includes only the longer variants as footnotes; the edition for Anthropology, History, and Education will contain even the shorter ones. 

As a sample of this translation, consider this passage from KGS VII: 324, using italic type for Kant's spaced type for emphasis:

III.  Die moralische Anlage.  Die Frage ist hier:  ob der Mensch von Natur gut, oder von Natur böse, oder von Natur gleich für eines oder das andere empfänglich sei, nachdem er in diese oder jene ihn bildende Hände fällt  (cereus in vitium flecti etc).  Im letztern Falle würde die Gattung selbst keinen Charakter haben. -- Aber dieser Fall widerspricht sich selbst; denn ein mit praktischem Vernunftvermögen und Bewußtsein der Freiheit seiner Willkür ausgestattetes Wesen (eine Person) sieht sich in diesem Bewußtsein selbst mitten in den dunkelsten Vorstellungen unter einem Pflichtgesetze und im Gefühl (welches dann das moralische heißt), daß ihm, oder durch ihn Anderen recht oder unrecht geschehe. 

Dowdell renders it:

3.  The moral gift.  Here the question is whether man is good by nature or bad by nature, or whether by nature he is equally susceptible to one or the other, depending upon which guiding hand he happens to fall into (cereus in vitium flecti etc) [endnote]; in this last instance the species itself would have no character.  But this last instance is contradictory in itself because a being endowed with the faculty of practical reason and with consciousness of free-will (a person) sees himself in this consciousness, even in the midst of the darkest imaginings, subject to a moral law and to the feeling (which is then called moral feeling) that he is treated justly or unjustly or that he is treating others justly or unjustly. [endnote] 

Gregor renders it:

III.  The moral predisposition.  The question here is:  whether man is good by nature, or evil by nature, or whether he is by nature equally receptive to good or evil, according as one or another hand happens to mould him (cereus in vitium flecti, etc) -- in which case the species itself would have no character.  -- But this [last] situation is self-contradictory.  For man is a being who has the power of practical reason and is conscious that his choice is free (a person); and in his consciousness of freedom and in his feeling (which is called moral feeling) that justice or injustice done to him or, by him, to others, he sees himself as subject to a law of duty, no matter how obscure his ideas about it may be. 

Louden renders it (228-29):

III.  The moral predisposition.  The question here is:  whether the human being is good by nature, or evil by nature, or whether he is by nature equally susceptible to one or the other, depending on whether this or that formative hand falls on him (cereus in vitium flecti etc.). [footnote]  In the latter case the species itself would have no character.  -- But this case is self-contradictory; for a being endowed with the power of practical reason and consciousness of freedom of his power of choice (a person) sees himself in this consciousness, even in the midst of the darkest representations, subject to a law of duty and to the feeling (which is then called moral feeling) that justice or injustice is done to him or, by him, to others. [footnote]

Some of Louden's terminology is superior to Gregor's and Dowdell's.  Using "man" for "Mensch" attributes to Kant the shorter, sexist English language term for "mankind" instead of the gender neutral "human being" (which ties etymologically with "humanity", i.e. "menschlichkeit").  Louden and Gregor use the better "evil" rather than "bad" for "böse", bringing out its full moral connotations.  Dowdell's "Gift" for "Anlage" is misleading, for although one might think of attributes as gifts of nature, Kant concludes that humans are in fact evil by nature, a Trojan horse of a gift if ever there was one.  Dowdell's "free-will" for "der Freiheit seiner Willkür" can cause some to conflate it with "Wille"; Gregor's better "his choice is free" is ambiguous between a single act and a faculty; while Louden's "freedom of his power of choice" best captures the premise Kant is giving about the awareness of an ability to be free.  But Dowdell provides "faculty" for "Vermögen", tying that term to Kant's usual use better than "power" does.  I think Gregor's "mould" has more style than either alternatives, but there is no philosophical import to it.  I cannot fathom why Gregor puts "last" in brackets.  Overall, Louden's translation is certainly more accurate than Dowdell's and about the same as Gregor's for philosophical precision.

Just as important is the material footnoted in Louden and Dowdell.  Gregor provides no notes for this passage, not even translating the Latin phrase, which the other two translate in notes.  Both Louden and Dowdell include an important passage from the Handschrift that differentiates between the species' predisposition to evil and the question whether any particular person is an evil human being.  All human beings are inclined ["geneigt"] to evil without thereby having a propensity ["Hang"] to evil.  This passage should be compared to the discussion of evil in the Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason.  In a few other instances, Louden includes some material from the Handschrift that Dowdell does not.  Louden's practice of using footnotes rather than endnotes is much more convenient. 

In sum, this new edition of the increasingly important Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View takes its place as the best edition when combining accuracy of translation with editorial apparatus.