Anti-Badiou: On the Introduction of Maoism into Philosophy

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François Laruelle, Anti-Badiou: On the Introduction of Maoism into Philosophy, Robin Mackay (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2013, xli + 246pp., $27.95, ISBN 978-1441195746.

Reviewed by Anthony Paul Smith, La Salle University


"No philosopher has ever expended so much talent, energy and knowledge in celebrating the void purified of all things, except perhaps Socrates -- does [Badiou] not deserve an Aristophanes?" (xxi) This is how François Laruelle casts his philosophical polemic against fellow Paris-based philosopher Alain Badiou, and, like Aristophanes, Laruelle does provide his readers with a lampooning of Badiou that is cutting and often very funny. Perhaps unlike the Greek playwright, Laruelle's polemic also reveals something true about the character of Badiou's philosophy. Undertaking a philosophical project in the genre of polemic is always dangerous. The risks are numerous, but two were foremost on my mind as I began to read Anti-Badiou: in a polemic the author invites scrutiny of his own work and style, and the author also risks eliding any real engagement with the subject of the polemic. In this text Laruelle wagers a polemic despite those risks and engages with Badiou by aping the latter's own polemical style to uncover what he sees as the authoritarian nature of Badiou's philosophy. In the process he also ends up presenting his own project using Badiou's as a contrasting counter-model.

Amongst contemporary French philosophers, Alain Badiou is a master polemicist. Most of his targets, however, have not been philosophers of talent equal to his own, and so he has rarely risked as much as Laruelle does here. Badiou's polemics have largely been limited to politicians, like former French President Nicolas Sarkozy, or public intellectuals like Bernard-Henri Lévy. But Laruelle's claim is that it seems "of more urgent and broader importance to write an Anti-Badiou than an Anti-Sarkozy" (xx), and so he takes the risks that come with engaging in a polemic in order to reveal that the strange hybrid of aristocratic values and political militancy Badiou embodies is nothing but the hybrid of a tin crown and toy gun. In meeting Badiou's own acerbic attacks on Laruelle and other philosophers (like Deleuze and Derrida), he shows us that Badiou is a philosopher -- and that this is precisely the problem, however obvious a statement it may seem. In what follows I will unpack the meaning of all of this through a summary of the book, but breaking off here and there to undertake a more focused discussion of the polemic, of what it reveals about Badiou's philosophy, and of the comparison that Laruelle makes between that philosophy and his own project of "non-philosophy".

The text begins with a short preface followed by an introduction that together lay out a summary of the text that follows and clearly delineate its purpose. There Laruelle tells us that the text is not primarily a polemic, though it plays with that form, nor a lampooning (which can always be turned back upon the attacker); rather Anti-Badiou is "a book in which non-philosophy explains itself to itself, but with the aid of a counter-model that it falls to us to transform" (xxxix). It is worth noting that in these chapters Laruelle's aping of Badiou's polemical style is fully displayed and that many of the most entertaining lines are found here. But Laruelle goes to great pains to stress that the project is not really an attack against Badiou the person; instead Badiou's work represents a paramount case of the essence of philosophy (or "Philosophy", as Mackay translates "la-philosophie"). This essence takes various names, including "philosophical faith" and "the principle of sufficient philosophy", but in each case what Laruelle claims to have found is the authoritarian and self-sufficient nature of philosophy -- that is, the way in which Philosophy (and he always refers to philosophy in the sense of a quasi-subject), in its particular instantiations, takes everything as able to be philosophized. While contemporary French philosophy, under the influence of Derrida's deconstruction and Deleuze and Guattari's schizoanalysis, has repressed this faith, Laruelle has attempted to show in his other works that this faith still lies beneath the surface and returns with a vengeance in their philosophical acts.1 Badiou represents the return of the repressed, an open return to this form of a dominating philosophy that has designs on -- or, mockingly recalling the five-year plans of the Soviets, creates plans for -- other disciplines.

From here the book takes a break in its polemic to step back and present the parallels and differences between Laruelle and Badiou in "A Brief Synoptic Parallel". This chapter was originally published under the pseudonym Tristan Aguilar in an edited volume in the mid-90s (witnessing to the long-term interest Laruelle has had in Badiou's work) and provides the background for why he might actually take up the work he presents here. In short, there is a certain similarity between their ideas concerning the relationship of philosophy and other disciplines or forms of knowledge. This surface similarity can be summarized as the claim that philosophy is not sufficient in itself to do its work, but always requires some extra-philosophical material for its own function. Laruelle then undertakes a more careful examination of those differences in order to spell out where his own project differs and does so, in his view, for the better. Certain key parallels and differences are then expanded in the chapters that follow.

From this very programmatic chapter he then moves to two chapters that make up the primary polemic of the book. Here the target is Badiou the Philosopher. As a polemicist Laruelle is entertaining, often times using self-deprecation as a weapon, such as when he writes, "we need only consider Badiou in himself to see that he is a technically irreproachable philosopher, and an intelligence in excess of us in every way" (xxxix). If the risk of a polemic is that the polemicist falls flat in his own writing, Laruelle quite deftly does not try to meet Badiou punch for punch. He refuses, as he says, to make this book a dialogue because the master will always win. Instead he aims to bring attention to Badiou's self-styled identity as a master, to show the ridiculousness in wanting to be a master. This is clear in "Taking the Side of the 'Modern' in Philosophy," where Laruelle discusses Badiou's return to an older style of philosophy within the Parisian scene: a return, really a "re-education," Laruelle claims, to philosophy as a kind of master discourse that speaks for the others. "Old and New Relations between Science and Philosophy" builds on this presentation of Badiou's philosophy by focusing on and attacking his conception of the relationship between science and philosophy.

For Laruelle, philosophy must be "mutated" by its engagement with another discipline, and he has set up, in other texts, the theoretical framework for what that change -- in terms of the division of labor between philosophy and extra-philosophical domains -- would look like.2 But Badiou has also developed his own plan for how that division of labor should look. In hisBeing and Event and Manifesto for Philosophy, Badiou develops his theory of the four truth-conditions that philosophy serves. But what Laruelle argues is that, in Badiou's return to a kind of modern (but not contemporary) philosophy, this supposedly humble philosophy is actually a more insidious form of control.3 Badiou's conditions always have a vanguardist character to them, so there is always some general name followed by its more radical core. The four truth-conditions, or privileged domains, that philosophy must interact with are science (mathematics), politics (communism, namely in its Maoist variant for much of his work), love (which has as its science psychoanalysis), and art (here Badiou has vacillated between poetry and film as the vanguard of the truth in art). Laruelle gently mocks the notion that there are four -- just these four -- truth-conditions, and he points out he is not the first or only one to do so.

But more importantly he criticizes Badiou for the way in which he modifies "the cartography of philosophical thought" making of it a "new 'hermeneutic'-type activity, to conserve the old philosophical finality but merely in a limited form" (23). In other words, in Badiou's modernist focus on finality, on the Idea that must be subtracted from the material of these disciplines, he is essentially saying that something like mathematics can think (the task of philosophy), but it does not know it can think and so the philosopher's task is to speak truthfully for the material. In short, philosophy appears as a helicopter parent, always speaking for the ignorant child who does not know what is good for it and never will. This is developed in more length in a later chapter, "Philosophy and Mathematics in the Mirror", where Laruelle pushes the polemic into a more focused critique of Badiou's use of mathematics. This critique takes place not on the grounds of any assumed weaknesses in Badiou's understanding of mathematics or set theory in particular, but on the use that Badiou makes of mathematics. For Laruelle the purpose of Badiou's thesis that "mathematics = ontology" is to simply intimidate other philosophers and theorists and set up his philosophy as the master philosophy, the defender ofPhilosophy, but not to truly challenge or transform the practice of philosophy itself.

Moving out of this polemic Laruelle turns again to the comparative task for the next two chapters. In "Matrices and Principles" he develops the differences in what could be called meta-philosophy for the two thinkers. Here Badiou's theory of how philosophy relates to truth-events is contrasted with Laruelle's own model of disempowering philosophy's pretensions by transforming its practices through a more unified relationship with other disciplines (namely, in this instance, science). "Subtraction and Superposition" focuses on two parallel practices in their respective philosophies: where Badiou attempts to strip away the extraneous elements of his privileged dialogue partners in order to get at the purified Idea, Laruelle takes as his model the superposition of waves where two waves retain their identity but create a third wave which is not a synthesis of those waves or their destruction. This chapter, along with a later one entitled "Ontology and Materiality", present a summary of non-philosophy and explain its general shape and style as it currently stands. In short, what Laruelle means by non-philosophy (or non-standard philosophy) is the generalization of philosophy much in the same way that non-Euclidean geometry generalized the Euclidean model. By locating the possible plural nature of philosophy as such -- in the same way, once again, that we have more than one model for geometry operating without any contradiction or negation at work between these models -- Laruelle is able to treat philosophy as just another material thing with the potential to be used by human beings.

In part this casting of philosophy as material is what Laruelle means by "disempowering" (what is also translated by Mackay as depotentializing and elsewhere, in relation to ecological concerns, the "degrowth of") philosophy. More precisely, the disempowerment is a disempowerment of the self-image philosophy so often projects of itself. Once this disempowerment is carried out, then philosophy may be combined with other domains or disciplines in order to experiment and potentially create new responses to problems. While Laruelle has developed his project over a number of decades, he has always attempted to engage with new material in order to challenge and deepen the project. In its current iteration he has attempted to "conjugate" philosophy with quantum physics. Since engagement with quantum physics by those who are not physicists is too often the purview of philosophical crackpots, this move may make the reader incredulous and is likely to make others uncomfortable at the very least. But Laruelle's engagement is more careful and narrow than those ready to "Sokalize" his work might expect. It is an attempt to model the ways in which Kant's philosophy was intimately influenced by the Newtonian model of physics. Laruelle does not try to form any kind of empirical claims in his engagement with quantum physics, and he does not make the claim that the field of quantum physics needs philosophy to make sense of itself. Rather, the images and concepts developed in the field allow for philosophy to re-conceive some of its own more fundamental ideas like identity and difference by processing them through new software (logiciel in French) or "quantware" (here Mackay's translation of the French quantiel is particularly inspired). This creation of a "philo-fiction" (playing on the idea of science fiction) would appear to mirror in some ways Badiou's "mathematics = ontology", except it is not a translation of one domain into another, but rather an attempt to "superpose" them, to transform the language game of one through a new kind of conjugation.

The book ends with "Philo-fiction," where Laruelle continues his presentation of his own project and gives us his own manifesto for an inventive philosophy that comes together with other disciplines in a less authoritarian and more democratic fashion. But what we also see in this final chapter is the scope of non-philosophy, a scope that moves from what we would normally refer to as meta-philosophy, to epistemology, then to philosophy of religion, and finally to ethics and political philosophy. The scope of Badiou's own interests are similarly wide, though Laruelle sees that as a symptom of his need to confirm "the old ideal of the philosopher, no longer counselor of the Prince . . . but (is this so different, however modern it may be?) master of militancy and of taking sides" (22). The scope then, for Laruelle, merely exists because each of these domains is another bit of material that can be used. So non-philosophy too has a politics and ethics, though Laruelle demands that any theoretical engagement in these areas cease using the victim, and the human being in general, as a philosophical weapon that allows philosophers to advance on opponents in debates. Instead, in the same way that philosophy must be mutated by science, politics and ethics must be mutated or determined by the victim and the stranger/foreigner.

This is a demand, not for the aggressive macho militancy present in Badiou's political writings, but for philosophy, and every authoritarian discourse, to stop harassing men and women. This is really the desire that Laruelle has for his project: that it may take discourses that so often play their role in subjugating human beings and, through a focused disempowerment of those discourses, transform them into something that may be used by those same human beings. In Anti-Badiou he makes the case that Badiou's philosophy too often deprives ordinary human beings of dignity, reducing them to servants of the Idea. Laruelle's wager is that a non-standard philosophy may become a way that the "radical Stranger" "works at transforming, with the aid of the world, the definitions of himself that he has received" (231).

1 In English see Laruelle's Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction to Non-Philosophy, trans. Rocco Gangle (London and New York: Continuum, 2010) and Rocco Gangle'sFrançois Laruelle's Philosophies of Difference: A Critical Introduction and Guide (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2013).

2 Namely Principles of Non-Philosophy, trans. Nicola Rubczak and Anthony Paul Smith (New York and London: Bloomsbury, 2013 [1996]) and his 2010 Philosophie non-standard. Générique, Quantique, Philo-fiction (Paris: Kimé, 2010).

3 Laruelle is not alone in this criticism of Badiou. Though the two make somewhat awkward bedfellows in arguing for very different correctives, Peter Osborne's review of Being and Event makes much the same argument against Badiou. See Peter Osborne, "Neo-Classic: Alain Badiou's Being and Event in Radical Philosophy 142 (March/April, 2007), pp. 19-29.