Anti-Hegelian Reading of Economic Theory

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Micocci, Andrea, Anti-Hegelian Reading of Economic Theory, Edwin Mellen Press, 424pp, $129.95 (hbk), ISBN 0773472754.

Reviewed by Antonio Callari, Franklin and Marshall College


Micocci’s is a book both difficult and worth coming to terms with. It is not a well-edited book,1 and the argument is developed in a style that seems at times repetitive and programmatic. But the book offers many possibilities for reflection and learning despite its style. Taking up incisively the question of the nature of the materialist approach in philosophy, the book develops that approach into a general critical perspective on the status of the ’social sciences:’ in their present constitution, the ’social sciences’ work to trap human beings within the logic of “society” and, to the extent that they (are allowed to) monopolize “knowledge,” they block the potential for human emancipation. The book is ambitious in the scope of social science work it covers: economics, political economy, sociology, psychology, politics (the theory of the state), each of which are reviewed in both their mainstream and critical approaches. It is also bold in the claim it makes: that Micocci’s is the only way out of the hypostatizing effects of social science knowledge (p. 362). For reasons I shall explain at the end of this review, I do not find that claim persuasive. But, its shortcomings notwithstanding, Micocci’s book makes some important contributions: it recovers some interesting and, at least in the anglophone world, inadequately known passes of materialism (those of Italian Marxism); it offers some (at least to me) eye-opening criticisms of the functionalist modes of the more traditional critical schools (e.g., institutionalism); and, finally, it speaks to the materialism of ideology and culture. It is in these respects, and possibly more, that Micocci’s book offers important moments of reflection and learning.

Micocci’s criticism of the social sciences is grounded in a general Epicurean philosophical approach that, in contradistinction to the logocentric approach extending from Democritus to Hegel (and, beyond Hegel, to orthodox Marxism and the social sciences), sees humans as natural beings in their concrete, material individualities (a kind of human atomism) and criticizes the attempt to reduce them to manifestations (simply expressions) of forces larger than themselves (society, history, indeed ’logos.’) Micocci thus introducers to his readers a number of thinkers (both ancient and modern: Aristotle, Polybius, Cicero, Aquinas, Machiavelli, Rousseau) who have represented “man” and “society” as being in a state of tension and accepted that tension as ultimately irreconcilable—even as each of them could have different positions on the pros and cons of the modus vivendi of man in society. Accepting the ultimate irreconcilability, these thinkers did not find a need for a common logos of man and society, and no need for a mechanism (eschatology, teleology, dialectics), therefore, to suture the space between them that the imagination of the logos has prefigured. Micocci has a particular, and particularly charged, relationship to Marxism, most of which (certainly the Marxism of most Marxists and certain moments in Marx himself) he sees as fitting into the logocentric mode. But he also values those parts of (and those ways of reading) Marx that are moments of rebellion against the logos. These include not only the young Marx—a Marx much in touch with the naturalistic Feuerbach—but also the moments at which, as was the case with Reich, Marcuse, and Adorno, the accent falls on the more powerful forces of repression of the natural (mental and sexual/sensual) potentialities of human beings.2 In between the stages of the Young Marx and of these theorists of repression, in Micocci’s run of Marxism, lies the work of Della Volpe and of Colletti, the two Italian philosophers most critically engaged in the post WWII Western European reconstruction of Marx (more on this below). Micocci draws inspiration from the spirit of all these emancipatory moments in Marxism even as he ends up judging all of them inadequate to the task of a final and complete break with the habit of preaching to human beings that their meaning is exhausted by one or another form of the logos.

Micocci’s argument is that the knowledge the so-called social sciences have produced and the reality of modern “social being” are in a mirror relationship to each other. “Being” as such, for Micocci is larger than “social being:” in addition to the dimension of sociality (the habits and patterns that fit a structure of society), the real includes two other dimensions: a dimension of naturality and a dimension of mediation (including the element of consciousness) between the natural and the social. The “social sciences” are located, by Micocci, in this space of mediation. In “capitalism” (more on that term later), both the “social being” and the “knowledge” produced by the typical social sciences are characterized by identical hypostatizing processes. They mirror each other, and in that mirroring exclude (hence must find a way of suppressing) the naturalistic, materialist, and individually concrete humans.3 This exclusion is typical not only of bourgeois social sciences, but also of discourses which, although they present themselves as critical of the mainstream disciplines, yet accept “society” as the object of analysis. The hypostatizing habit (the empowering of social abstractions) of these discourses is strategically related to a (self-imposed) need of theirs to reduce economic agents (“individuals” in mainstream economics, “classes” and “individuals” in Marxian economics, “institutions” in the case of the institutionalists) to elements of a “system,” elements, that is, which both obey (in “reality”) and symbolize (in “discourse”) the relational structures functional to that system (it matters little whether this “system” is conceived in static or historicist ways). Operating with a concept of “society” as a “system force-field,” the social sciences, Micocci argues, identify the agency effects that would structure and naturalize the reproduction of that force-field and proceed to conceptualize agents and institutions as no more than those necessary effects and, at the same time, as the effective cause of these effects/structures: a hypostasis of system (the presumed force of reproduction) and a straight-jacketing of human agency.

Now, according to Micocci, the hypostasis of system and straight-jacketing of human agency is something at work in the reality of “capitalist” society as well as in the strategies of the social sciences. The strategy of the social sciences is not capricious but corresponds rather homologously with the life experiences of human agents, at least to the extent that these agents come, and continue, to behave in ways that reproduce capitalist “society.” Micocci does not question the existence of processes that condition human agency to these reproductive behavioral patterns (e.g., workers who continue to sell their “labor-power,” or firms which continue to administer financial markets). What he argues against is the “system force-field” epistemic of the social sciences, the idea, that is, that “system” as such has the force to kneed human agency into shape of reproductive functionality (he is, for example, critical of the Marxian theory of commodity fetishism, which he reads as an assertion of the power of commodity relations themselves (understood as an economic structure) to shape a particular form of consciousness and impose it on human agents. Against the “system force-field” epistemic, Micocci wants to preserve the ability of human beings to be free, to respond to needs and desires that they are free to conceive independently of (and, I suppose, he might even say “in struggle with,” or “in reaction to”) the logic of system function: hence his interest in the Epicurean philosophical tradition, in which chance trumps necessity, elements trump structure, and humanity trumps “citizenship.” Micocci calls for a return of the world of “social science” to the realm of philosophy (that is what he means by a “new political economy”) where the naturalistic, materialist and concrete qualities of human experiences can be given as much recognition as the qualities of sociality and citizenship. It is only in such a return of “knowledge” to the Epicurean philosophical tradition that Micocci sees the opportunity to break the complicity of the “knowledge” (and of “culture”) with the repressive socialization practices of capitalism (or socialism, for that matter).

There is much to learn here for readers who are interested in a criticism of bourgeois social sciences and of teleological Marxism. Micocci’s outline of the ways in which Della Volpe and Colletti wrestled with the Hegelian roots of Marxism could well be very useful for Anglophone readers whose introduction to the tension between Marxism and Hegel has come primarily through Althusser (whose own relationship to Italian Marxism, I suspect, may still hold some suggestive leads). There is also the matter of Micocci’s criticisms of the institutionalists (namely, that their identification of the institutions of interest does not place them outside the logic of the “system”): even if at times that criticism seems forced, it still offers a useful way to think about the intellectual conditions within which institutionalism itself has operated. And finally, Micocci offers some interesting thoughts on the ways in which capitalist ideology actually reproduces itself: by rote, by drill, by iterativity. (This question of ideology, as is well known, is central also in the work of Althusser, and, Micocci’s own attempts to distance himself from Althusser notwithstanding, both there and here the accent falls on the materiality of ideological practices, and away from the assumption of “system” force).

But Micocci’s book is also problematic in an important way. Let me start with a matter of style: in the course of making these valuable contributions, Micocci is not often gracious to the various theorists whose works he criticizes; his representations of their “shortcomings” (as he sees them, of course) as complicit with the hegemony of bourgeois rule is reminiscent of the politicizing of intellectual work that marked the phase of really existing socialism. Now, I would pass on this aspect of the book, except for the fact that it is, in my view, related to a serious problem in the content of Micocci’s argument. The problem is in the type of relationship Micocci sees between the “social reality” and the world of “social science knowledge.” In my view, Micocci is quite correct in criticizing the orthodox model by which “knowledge” would be the effect of the system (e.g., commodity fetishism as the product of some “already existing” economic structure). He, however, seems to accept the idea that the relationship between knowing and social being is one of correspondence and homology, so that knowledge and social being are in a mirroring relationship (with the mirror itself losing its material character, a kind of “virtual mirror.”) For Micocci, then, if it isn’t the reality of capitalist economic relations (the orthodox meaning of “capitalism”) that produces the culture (the network of knowledges) of capitalism, it must be the reality of a form of knowledge (culture)—that being, of course, the reality of the hypostatizing habit—that produces “capitalism.” Micocci is quite emphatic in his representation of capitalism as the product of a certain culture. But there is a problem here, for it seems to me that, in reducing capitalism to a mirroring effect of the culture of hypostasis, Micocci is simply reproducing the tight relation between knowing and being that he so strongly criticizes in the Hegelian system—he is, in this way, simply re-reversing the traditional Marxist relationship between knowing and being back to its Hegelian architectonics. To this, Micocci would surely reply that the charge does not hold, because he has that third leg of “reality” (“man” as he exists naturally outside of the relation between knowing and “social being”) to expand the field of history beyond the grip of the mirroring operation. Granted! But, in this book, the relation between knowledge and social being remains one that is tightly, very tightly, a (virtual) mirroring relation, and I can see no argument other than assertion (derived, I presume, from a continuing acceptance of some catechism) as to why this should be so. Why couldn’t there be discontinuities, ruptures, heterologies, etc. in the world of knowledge, and in the relationship between that world and the world of social being? More on that below. Even if it is true that there are important elements of being which have remained outside the logic of both modernist knowledge and capitalist logic, it does not follow that there are no spaces for ruptures in the world of knowledge. To rule out those possibilities in the way Micocci does seems unwise. It also seems to be the product of a hypostasis of Micocci’s own: the attribution of a power of the hypostatizing habit to contain concrete discourses within its logic. To me, that is exactly what Micocci seems to be doing when he posits a relationship of homology between the social science knowledges he criticizes and capitalist discipline. That he sees the reproduction of capitalism as the direct effect of the culture of knowledges is what, I think, leads him to put some emotional charge in his criticism of the producers of these knowledges and of those critics who do not go far enough (Lawson, Bhaskar, Zizek, figure prominently as targets of his criticism). The knowledge producers are not the lackeys of the bourgeoisie, but lackeys they remain: lackeys of a certain philosophical approach.4

Micocci’s tight relationship between social science knowledges and social being is so strong that it leaves him with no way of seeing any spiral for the emancipation of humanity beyond the logic of capitalism other than through a total rejection of that space. This leads him to some places which, as logically as they seem to derive from the logic of his set up, yet seem strange. The only knowledges which are consistent with human emancipation are constituted as technical knowledges (and “economics” would be one of these). As for social knowledge, Micocci stays at the level of offering us a promise of it, a promise that only future work can fulfill: this book could only develop the critique of the present constitution of social knowledge. But it is difficult to see what this work would be, what its concrete form will be, and whether it can ever be as clean of the notion of “society” as Micocci suggests it can be. To be sure, I am not questioning the value of Micocci’s critique of the hypostases of the social sciences. But it is legitimate to question his claim that his is the only path to a recovery of the conditions for human emancipation. Micocci is rather dismissive of other intellectual paths to the goal of emancipation, or at least the goal of breaking the force of capitalist metaphysics/hypostases on the human mind. I have in mind here the work of postmodern and deconstructive critics of capitalism and of logocentric discourse. I would only mention here, as examples, 1) the work of a critic like Spivak, who, with deconstructionist and postcolonial sensibilities, suggests that the Marxist architectonics remain valuable for their ability to theorize, at one and the same time, the structuring powers of capitalist processes and the inevitable gaps within and among them, and 2) the work of the Rethinking Marxism collective (an association with which I disclose) which has done so much to “read” Marx, including the Marx of Capital, as a theorist of ruptures outside the logic of the dialectic (a more Spinozist Marx, following the leads of the Althusserian school). There is a lot of work that moves critical theory in general, and Marxism in particular, towards a rupture with the teleology and system essentialism that Micocci is criticizing. This work has, in my view, the virtue of offering an even more radical departure from the Marxist orthodoxy than Micocci himself offers, because it does not retain the tight link between knowing and (social) being that Micocci retains. But Micocci does not engage this work, and his claim about his being the only way out of the metaphysics of modern/ist knowledge is thus not very modest or convincing.


1. The author is Italian, and there are plenty of idiomatic expressions not properly rendered into English. The need for a copy-editing process is evident, and it is a shame that the Mellen Press did not provide it.

2. Micocci, of course, does not have a concept of what constitutes “man” beyond this open field of possibilities, any such concept being, by its very nature, a form of logocentrism: he even rejects the concept of “homo faber” because of the social “structuring” to which it was reduced in the “theory” of “socialism.”

3. The hypostatizing habit, Micocci argues, is characteristic of the social sciences as they have come to constitute themselves in separation from the concern of early “political economy” with philosophy and the natural condition of human beings (Smith as a moral philosopher, and the early Marx of the Theses on Feuerbach).

4. Micocci sees the production of the culture that sustains capitalism as the effect of practices other than knowledge production according to the social science protocols. But this does not change the nature of the problem to which I am pointing, which is a problem of the homology between knowledge and social being and of the reduction, in principle, of capitalist reality to an effect of culture.